How to Cite the SEP

To cite the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy, we recommend the following bibliographic format, which you may need to adapt to meet the style requirements of the publication for which you are writing.

Typically, users read the current ‘active’ version of each entry. This is the version you reach directly from our main Table of Contents. However, because Encyclopedia entries are subject to periodic revision, it is more appropriate to cite one of the ‘archived’ versions of the entry. When you quote from an entry, it is particularly important to cite an archived version, for otherwise the passage you cite might disappear from the active version of the entry. Be sure to verify that the passage you are quoting matches what is in the archived version. For some scholarly purposes, it might be important to cite the earliest version in our Archives that matches the current version. But any archived SEP entry is citable.

If the material you wish to cite has not been archived (because the entry is new or has been recently modified), you should, if possible, wait for the next archived version of the Encyclopedia. Fixed editions of the Encyclopedia are created and archived every three months, on the 21st of September, December, March, and June.

To make the citation process easier, each entry has an “Author and Citation Info” link in the box of menu items located at the top left corner of the entry. This takes you to a page with specific citation information for that entry. For example, the citation information page for Jeff Malpas' entry on Donald Davidson will show you a citation of the following form:

Malpas, J., “Donald Davidson”, The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Winter 2012 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <>.

Note that the above URL ends in the name “davidson” followed by a slash “/”. “davidson” is the name of the directory which contains the entry. The filename of the entry itself is “index.html” (indeed, all the entries in the Encyclopedia are named “index.html”). However, you need not include the entry filename at the end of the URL. By default, our web server will send the file “index.html” when a web browser requests a URL such as the one displayed above.

Again, the above citation is only an example. To get the current citation information for the Donald Davidson entry or any other entry, please go to the entry and click on the “Author and Citation Info” link in the menu list located in the box at the top left corner of each entry.

If you require other kinds of bibliographic information, you may find the following facts helpful.

If you have any further questions, please contact the SEP.