Notes to Judah Abrabanel

1. This is argued most forcefully in David Hariri, “The Traces of the Missing Fourth Dialogue on Love by Judah Abravanel, Known as Leone Ebreo” (Hebrew), Italia 7.1-2 (1988), pp. 93-155.

2. E.g., Cecil Roth, The History of the Jews in Italy (Philadelphia: Jewish Publication Society of America, 1946), pp. 193-215; Moses Avigdor Shulvass, The Jews in the World of the Renaissance (Leiden: Brill, 1973); Davd B. Ruderman, The World of a Renaissance Jew: The Life and Thought of Abraham ben Mordechai Farissol (Cincinnati: Hebrew Union College Press, 1983).

3. E.g., Robert Bonfil, “The Historian's Perception of the Jews in the Italian Renaissance: Towards a Reappraisal,” Revue des etudes juives 143 (1984), pp. 59-82. For further methodological considerations, see the discussion in Hava Tirosh-Rothschild, “Jewish Culture in Renaissance Italy: A Methodological Survey,” Italia 9.1-2 (1990), esp. pp. 82ff.; Arthur M. Lesley, “The Place of the Dialoghi d'Amore in Contemporaneous Jewish Thought,” in Essential Papers on Jewish Culture in Renaissance and Baroque Italy, ed. David B. Ruderman (New York: New York University Press, 1992), pp. 170-188.

4. For an examination of the typical education curriculum of an elite Jew at this time, see Moshe Idel, “The Study Program of R. Yohanan Alemmano” (Hebrew), Tarbiz 48 (1979), pp. 303-330.

5. Judah Abrabanel, “Telunah ‘al ha-zeman” in Mivhar ha-Shirah ha-Ivrit be-Italyah, ed. Jefim Hayyim Schirmann (Berlin: Schocken, 1934), pp. 216-222. The English translation comes from Raymond Scheindlin, “Judah Abrabanel to His Son,” Judaism 41 (1992), pp. 190-199.

6. Judah Abrabanel, Dialoghi d'amore, ed. Santino Caramella (Bari: Gius. Laterza and Figli, 1929), III, p. 239. For a somewhat outdated English translation, especially in terms of its unwillingness to capture the erotic nature of the Italian, see The Philosophy of Love (Dialoghi d'Amore), trans. F. Friedeberg-Seeley and Jean H. Barnes (London: Soncino Press, 1937), p. 280. In subsequent citations from this work, I give the book and page number from the standard Italian edition of Caramella and put the page number from the English translation in parentheses. Also, see the comments of Philo in Dialoghi III, p. 351 (Friedeberg-Seeley and Barnes, p. 418).

7. Dialoghi III, p. 245 (Friedeberg-Seeley and Barnes, p. 289).

8. See the important comments in David B. Ruderman, “Italian Renaissance and Jewish Thought,” in Renaissance Humanism: Foundations, Forms, and Legacy, ed. Albert Rabil, Jr. (Philadelphia: University of Pennsylvania Press, 1988), vol. 1, esp. pp. 407-412.

9. Azaria de'Rossi, Meqor Einayim, ed. David Cassel (Vilna: n.p., 1886), p. 10.

10. Tullia d'Aragona, “Della Infintà de amore,” in Trattati d'amore del Cinquecento, ed. Giuseppe Zonta (Bari: G. Laterza & figli, 1912), p. 225. The work itself was originally published in 1547.

11. Of particular interest is Pietro Bembo (1470-1547) a contemporary of Judah Abrabanel, and someone who also wrote an important dialogue of love. In his Prose della Volgar Lingua (Padova: Liviana, 1955), Bembo made the case that Italian writers of his generation should write in Tuscan rather than in other dialects. Although he did not publish this work until 1525, he nevertheless wrote some time between 1497 and 1502 his Gli Asolani, itself a dialogue on love, in Italian, and which was subsequently published in 1505. This was one of the earliest examples of a prose work written in Italian. This, in turn, was intimately related to the emerging role of Tuscan nationalism. In this regard, also see Mario Sansone, Da Bembo a Galiani: Il Dibattio sulla Lingua in Italia (Bari: Adriatica, 1999), pp. 24-36.

12. Barbara Garvin, “The Language of Leone Ebreo's Dialoghi d'Amore,” Italia 13-15 (2001), p. 194.

13. For general background, see Hava Tirosh-Rothschild, Between Worlds: The Life and Thought of Rabbi David ben Judah Messer Leon (Albany: State University of New York Press, 1991), pp. 85-90. For a more specific discussion of Don Isaac Abrabanel, see Eric Lawee, Isaac Abarbanel's Stance Toward Tradition: Defense, Dissent, and Dialogue (Albany: State University of New York Press, 2001) and Seymour Feldman, Philosophy in a Time of Crisis: Don Isaac Abravanel, Defender of the Faith (London: RoutledgeCurzon, 2003).

14. For a good analysis of where and how Judah's work fits into the Renaissance genre of the trattato d'amore (“treatise on love”), see John Charles Nelson, Renaissance Theory of Love: The Context of Giordano Bruno's Eroici furori (New York: Columbia University Press, 1958), pp. 67-162.

15. Norman Roth, “The ‘Theft of Philosophy’ by the Greeks from the Jews,” Classical Folio 32 (1978), pp. 52-67.

16. Dialoghi III, p.351 (Friedberg-Seeley and Barnes, p. 419).

17. Dialoghi III, p. 291 (Friedberg-Seeley and Barnes, p. 345).

18. See my “Epigone, Innovator, or Apologist: The Case of Judah Abravanel,” The Dynamics of Jewish Epigonism, eds. Shlomo Berger and Irene Zweip (forthcoming, 2006);Lesley, “The Place of the Dialoghi,” p. 182.

19. Here, it seems to me that Colette Sirat seriously misreads the intent of the Dialoghi when she writes that it was “written in a secular language and represent[s] a work of profane philosophy.” See her A History of Jewish Philosophy in the Middle Ages (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1985), p. 408.

20. Dialoghi III, p. 226 (Friedberg-Seeley and Barnes, p. 264).

21. Dialoghi III, p. 226 (Friedberg-Seeley and Barnes, p. 265).

22. Dialoghi III, p. 227 (Friedberg-Seeley and Barnes, p. 266).

23. See the comments in Alexander Altmann, “Ars Rhetorica as Reflected in Some Jewish Figures,” in Essential Papers on Jewish Culture in Renaissance and Baroque Italy, ed. David B. Ruderman (New York: New York University Press, 1992), pp. 70-71;Tirosh-Rothschild, Between Worlds, pp. 66-70.

24. E.g., Ficino, Theologica Platonica (Paris: Société d'edition “Les belles lettres”, 1964-1970), vol. 2, p. 203.

25. Dialoghi, III, p. 282 (Friedeberg-Seeley and Barnes, p. 333).

26. Pines argues that the hidden source of Judah's theory is Avicenna's Risâla fî al-‘ishq. See his “Medieval Doctrines in Renaissance Garb?: Some Jewish and Arabic Sources of Leone Ebreo's Doctrines,” in Jewish Thought in the Sixteenth Century, ed. Bernard Dov Cooperman (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1983), esp. pp. 380-389. Although he makes a strong case, the fact of the matter (as Pines himself admits) is that there exists no firm proof that Judah either knew Arabic or that the Risâla fî al-‘ishq was ever translated into Latin or Hebrew. Another important and more direct source for Judah, however, could have been Hasdai Crescas' Light of the Lord.

27. Dialoghi III, p. 349 (Friedeberg-Seeley and Barnes, p. 416). Feldman argues, correctly in my opinion, that Judah “has thus reinterpreted both the Timaeus and the Symposium in terms of the Enneads. See the discussion in Seymour Feldman, “1492: A House Divided,” in Crisis and Creativity in the Sephardic World: 1391-1648, ed. Benjamin R. Gampel (New York: Columbia University Press, 1997), esp. pp. 50-52.

28. Dialoghi III, p. 349 (Friedberg-Seeley and Barnes, pp. 416-417). See the comments in Perry, Erotic Spirituality, p. 23.

29. Dialoghi III, p. 355-357 (Friedberg-Seeley and Barnes, p. 424-425). See Feldman, “1492,” pp. 52-53.

30. E.g., Dialoghi III, pp. 329-330 (Friedberg-Seeley and Barnes, p. 393). The Italian reads: “Sono adunque le bellezze corporee nel nostro intelletto spirituale, e come tali conoscono da lui.”

31. Dialoghi III, p. 316 (Friedberg-Seeley and Barnes, p. 376).

32. Dialoghi III, p. 316 (Friedberg-Seeley and Barnes, p. 376).

33. Dialoghi III, p. 316 (Friedberg-Seeley and Barnes, p. 376).

34. Dialoghi I, p. 38 (Friedberg-Seeley and Barnes, p. 41).

35. Perry, Erotic Spirituality, p. 17. For medieval precursors, see David C. Lindberg, Theories of Vision from al-Kindi to Kepler (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1976), esp. ch. 1. For more contemporaneous theories, see Katherine H. Tachau, Vision and Certitude in the Age of Ockham: Optics, Epistemology and the Foundation of Semantics (Leiden: E.J. Brill, 1988).

36. Dialoghi III, p. 327 (Friedberg-Seeley and Barnes, p. 389). The Italian reads: “sua luce illumina i nostri occhi e li fa comprendere tutte le lucide bellezze corporee.”

37. Dialoghi III, p. 277 (Friedberg-Seeley and Barnes, p. 328).

38. Dialoghi III, p. 275 (Friedberg-Seeley and Barnes, p. 325). Judah, unlike Maimonides, hints that this is not a completely natural act; rather it occurs through “the grace of God” (per grazia di Dio). Significantly, Alemanno argues that the grace of God is also necessary for a human to attain the level of prophecy. In this regard, see Fabrizio Lelli, “Yohanan Alemanno, Giovanni Pico della Mirandola e la cultura ebraica italiano del XV secolo,” in Giovanni Pico della Mirandola: Convegno internazionale di studi nel cinquecentesimo anniversario della morte (1494-1994), ed. G.C. Garfagnini (Firenze: L.S. Olschki, 1997), pp. 303-325.

39. Dialoghi III, p. 276 (Friedberg-Seeley and Barnes, p. 326).

40. This tripartite structure was also extensively used by Pico in his Heptaplus, where the intermediate world, that of the angels, corresponds to the domain of the human imagination. According to Wirszubski, an important source for Pico was probably Bahya ben Asher's Commentary on the Pentateuch. See his Pico dell Mirandola's Encounter with Jewish Mysticism, appendix 17.

41. Hughes, "Transforming the Maimonidean Imagination,” pp. 476-479.

42. Dialoghi III, p. 331 (Friedberg-Seeley and Barnes, p. 394).

43. Dialoghi III, p. 331 (Friedberg-Seeley and Barnes, pp. 394-395).

44. For elaboration on this topic, see A.W. Price, Love and Friendship in Plato and Aristotle. (Oxford: Clarendon, 1997).

45. See the important comments in Hava Tirosh-Rothschild, “Jewish Philosophy on the Eve of Modernity,” in History of Jewish Philosophy, eds. Daniel H. Frank and Oliver Leaman (London and New York: Routledge, 1997), pp. 522-523.

46. Dialoghi III, pp. 217-218 (Friedberg-Seeley and Barnes, p. 254).

47. E.g., Dialoghi I, p. 52; III, pp. 183, 226-229 (Friedberg-Seeley and Barnes, p. 57; pp. 212, 264-268.

48. Light of the Lord, II, 6, 1, qtd. from Warren Zev Harvey, Physics and Metaphysics in Hasdai Crescas (Amsterdam: J.C. Gieben, 1998), p. 111. For a comparison of certain passages from Crescas and the Dialoghi, see further Harvey, pp. 114-117.

49. Dialoghi III, p. 382 (Friedberg-Seeley and Barnes, pp. 456-457).

50. Dialoghi III, p. 376 (Friedberg-Seeley and Barnes, pp. 449-450). The source of this concept has been the subject of some debate. According to Damiens, Abrabanel would have derived this from Ficino by way of the Alexandrian mystics, especially Pseudo-Dionysius. See her Amor et intellect chez Léon L'Hébreu, esp. pp. 162ff. Zimmels sees in it a kabbalistic influence. See, in particular, his Leone Hebreo, Neue Studien (Wien: n.p., 1892), p. 39. Klausner argues that it comes from ibn Gabirol. See his “Don Yehudah Abrabanel and His Philosophy of Love” (Hebrew) Tarbiz 3 (1933), p. 94. Idel, however, faults the last two for offering no sources. In contrast, he claims, quite plausibly, that Judah Abrabanel's source is al-Batalyawsi, perhaps as received from his father's commentary to Genesis, or from Yohanan Alemanno. See Idel, “The Source of the Circle of Love in the Dialoghi d'amore” (Hebrew), Iyyun 28 (1978), p. 156.

51. Dialoghi III, p. 378 (Friedberg-Seeley and Barnes, p. 451). The Italian reads: “che ognuno con caritá paterna causa la produzione del suo succedente inferiore, participandoli il suo essere o bellezza paterna, ben che in minor grado secondo conviene.”

52. Dialoghi III, p. 228 (Friedberg-Seeley and Barnes, p. 267).

53. The conception of mirrors and their relationship to prophecy appears in Jewish sources as early as the rabbinic tradition (e.g., Lev. Rabba 20), a passage that would be subsequently interpreted by medieval Jewish authors.

54. C.f., Plotinus, Enneads I.4.10. For requisite secondary literature, see Annick Charles, “L'imagination, miroir de l'âme selon Proclus,” in Le néoplatonisme (Paris: Centre national de la recherche scientifique, 1971), pp. 241-251; Manfred Ullmann, Das Motiv des Spiegels in der arabischen Literatur des Mittelalters (Gottingen: Vandenhoek and Ruprecht, 1992), esp. pp. 62-120.

55. Dialoghi I, p. 33 (Friedberg-Seeley and Barnes, p. 35). The Italian reads: “Non vedi tu che s'imprime e comprende la forma de l'uomo nel specchio, non secondo il perfetto essere umano, ma secondo la capacitá e forza de la perfezione del specchio? il quale è solamente figurativo e non essenziale."

56. Dialoghi III, p. 254 (Friedberg-Seeley and Barnes, p. 300).

57. Dialoghi II, p. 73-74 (Friedberg-Seeley and Barnes, pp. 81-82). The Italian reads: “Sí che questa è la propria e ordinaria moglie del corpo celeste; e gli altri elementi son sue concubine. Per ciò che in lei genera il cielo tutta o ver la maggior parte dela sua generazione.”

58. E.g., Maimonides, Guide, introduction (Pines, pp. 13-14); III. 8 (Pines, pp. 430-436). On the somewhat ambiguous approach of Maimonides to matter, see Idit Dobbs-Weinstein, Maimonides and St. Thomas on the Limits of Reason (Albany: State University of New York Press, 1995), pp. 90-102.

59. Dialoghi II, p. 76 (Friedberg-Seeley and Barnes, pp. 84-85). The Italian reads: “Pur con quest'adultero amore s'adorna il mondo inferiore di tanta e cosí mirabil diversitá di cose cosi bellamente formate.”

60. Dialoghi II, p. 68 (Friedberg-Seeley and Barnes, p. 75). I, thus, disagree with Davidson who claims “Leone happens to be interpolating a philosophic discussion into a dialogue on love and consequently feels called upon to pay obeisance to the concepts of love and beauty.” See Herbert Davidson, “Medieval Jewish Philosophy in the Sixteenth Century,” in Jewish Thought in the Sixteenth Century, edited by B.D. Cooperman, p. 127.

61. In this regard, see the important discussion by Abraham Melamed, “The Transformation of the Love-of-the-Noble Motif in Albo, Alemanno, Judah Abrabanel, and Moscato” (Hebrew) in The Philosophy of Leone Ebreo: Four Lectures, pp. 62-66.

62. Dialoghi III, p. 269 (Friedberg-Seeley and Barnes, p. 318).

63. See the discussion in Suzanne Damiens, Amor et intellect chez Léon L'Hébreu (Toulouse: Edouard Privat, 1971), pp. 168ff.

64. Dialoghi III, p. 389 (Friedberg-Seeley and Barnes, p. 465). The Italian reads: “per il quale, quando vede una persona in sé bella di bellezzaa se stessa conveniente, conosce in quella e per quella la bellezza divina, però che ancor quella persona è immagine de la divina bellezza.”

65. Dialoghi III, p. 357 (Friedberg-Seeley and Barnes, p. 426).

66. Dialoghi II, p. 196 (Friedberg-Seeley and Barnes, p. 227).

67. For contemporaneous or near-contemporaneous ideas of the incarnation in Christian letters and philosophy, see Guy P. Raffa, Divine Dialectic: Dante's Incarnational Poetry (Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 2000), pp. 67-125; Richard Cross, The Metaphysics of Incarnation: Thomas Aquinas to Duns Scotus (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2002), pp. 29-51; Alexandre Leupin, Fiction and Incarnation: Rhetoric, Theology, and Literature in the Middle Ages, translated by David Laatsch (Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 2003), pp. 1-24.

Copyright © 2012 by
Aaron Hughes <aaron.hughes@rochester.edu>

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