Supplement to Actualism

The Barcan Formula is Logically True

Proof: To say that the Barcan Formula is logically true is to say that every instance of BF is logically true, that is, that every instance of BF is trueI, for every interpretation I. So let ◊∃xφ → ∃x◊φ be an instance of BF and I be an arbitrary interpretation. To show that this formula is trueI, the definition of “trueI” tells us that we must show that the formula is trueI,f at the actual world w0, for every assignment function f. Because the formula is a conditional, to show it is trueI, we assume, for an arbitrary assignment f, that the antecedent is trueI,f at w0 and then show that the consequent is trueI,f at w0. So let f be an assignment and assume that the antecedent ◊∃xφ of our instance is trueI,f at w0. By the definition of truth at a world (under I and f) for modal formulas, it follows that ∃xφ is trueI,f at some possible world, say w1. It follows by the definition of truth at a world for quantified formulas that, for some individual a in the domain of I, φ is trueI,f[x,a] at w1 and, hence, by the definition of truth at a world for modal formulas again, that ◊φ is trueI,f[x,a] at w0. So, again, by the definition of truth at a world for quantified formulas, ∃x◊φ is trueI,f at w0.

Copyright © 2008 by
Christopher Menzel <cmenzel@tamu.edu>

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