Notes to Actualism

1. There is no uniformity in the literature on the use of ‘existence’ and its cognates as it relates to the distinction between being and actuality. Unlike ‘being’, which is pretty much universally taken to indicate the broadest ontological category encompassing absolutely everything there is in any sense, ‘existence’ is sometimes used to indicate being and other times actuality. In this article I will follow the terminology initially fixed by Russell [1903] (§427) and will contrast being with existence and, hence, I will take ‘existence’, ‘actual existence’, and ‘actuality’ (and their cognates), within any metaphysical context, all to indicate the same property. Stylistically, I will typically contrast existence with being and actuality with possibility. For emphasis only, I will sometimes use the (redundant) expressions ‘actually exists’, ‘actually existing’, and ‘actual existence’.

2. “Tarskian semantics” is a bit of a misnomer. Tarski's work was certainly the genesis of the modern day semantics for first-order logic, but its current form — due, largely, to Kemeny [1956a/b] — is quite different from what one actually finds in Tarski's writings, particularly in the centrality in modern semantics of the mathematical notion of an interpretation of an otherwise completely uninterpreted formal language. See Tarski [1936] (translated as “The Concept of Truth in Formalized Languages” in Tarski [1956]) as well as the entry on Tarski's Truth Definitions.

3. We assume here that, as with all natural kinds, being an Alien is an essential property of anything that has it.

4. A potential actualist move is worth addressing here. One might argue that, in fact, there is a straightforward actualist account of the possibility of Aliens. A widely-accepted contemporary metaphysical belief is that, for every set of objects, there exists the mereological sum consisting of exactly those objects. Given this, assuming that Aliens are composed of the same basic atomic stuff that we are, there are surely actual merological sums of atoms that are possible Aliens, i.e., that could have been Aliens if only they'd been properly arranged. Hence, there is no need to postulate possibilia to provide a semantics for claims like ‘It is possible that there are Aliens’. However, this objection misses the point. The general intuition that we are attempting to isolate with the Alien example is that

(*) There could have been things other than the things that actually exist.

All that the actualist move just noted succeeds in showing is that perhaps the Alien example doesn't entail (*). But it does not succeed in accounting for the intuition that (*) is true. For suppose we accept the proposed mereological gambit, i.e., that certain mereological sums of actual atoms could have been Aliens, or instances of any other uninstantiated natural kind. Is it not still the case that there could have been different atoms (or quarks or whatever basic building blocks you choose) than there are in fact? Indeed, is it not logically possible that the universe could have been composed of entirely different stuff altogether? If so, then the actualist still needs to account for (*).

It should also be noted that the mereological gambit itself is dubious. Its basic premise — that any collection of atoms constitutes a further physical object — is far from uncontroversial. More seriously, it seems quite clear that no instance of a physical natural kind is identical with any given mereological sum of atoms, as physical bodies are constituted by many different sums of atoms across time as those bodies change. Moreover, the view, as Williamson [2000] (p. 202) notes, implies an “implausibly reductive” view of the metaphysics of physical objects. Notably, mereological sums, for example survive scattering, whereas the objects they constitute typically do not.

Perhaps, however, the actualist could come up with some more sophisticated mereological construct C to avoid this objection. Still, it seems, there are problems. Again, intuitively, it seems that one and the same construct C, structured one way, could have been an instance of one kind, and structured another, could have been an instance of a different kind. But then it seems to follow from the “modal transitivity” of identity (i.e., the principle: ∀x□∀y(y=x → □∀z(x=zy=z))) that if a member of a natural kind is literally identical with a C, then it is possible that an instance of a given kind could have been an instance of a very different kind. But this conflicts with strong intuitions about the essentiality of kind membership. So even if the actualist's hypothetical construct C were plausible, rather than taking Cs to be actualist surrogates for possible Aliens (or whatever), it would be at least equally reasonable to claim that certain Cs are only possibly co-located with, or possibly constitutive of, but not possibly identical with, an Alien. For, in that case, all that follows is that the same C might have been co-located with (or constitutive of) instances of very different natural kinds, and intuitions about the essentiality of kind membership are preserved.

5. Note that NE and NNE are not strictly entailed by possibilism, taken as the thesis that there are things that do not exist, but which could have existed. For there seems to be nothing inconsistent in the idea of a thing that contingently fails to exist and also only contingently is. But the idea is odd. For what contingent facts could have made it the case that, for a given possibile a, instead of simply failing to exist, there was no such thing as a at all? Many things can intuitively account for a possible object failing to exist, e.g., the failure of two persons to meet who might otherwise have had children together. But what relevant, substantive difference distinguishes worlds in which a fails to exist from those in which a fails to be altogether? No substantive answer is forthcoming; it would have to be taken as an inexplicable brute fact. For the possibilist, therefore, mere possibilia are most naturally taken to be necessary beings.

6. There is controversy in the literature over whether actualism entails serious actualism. Fine [1985] (pp. 163ff) and Pollock [1985] (pp. 126f) both argue that the latter does not follow from the former. Plantinga himself argued in [1979] (Section III) that it does, although he later recanted in [1983], where he points out the “flocculent thinking” (p. 12) of his earlier argument. He was not, however, persuaded by the arguments of Fine and Pollock against the entailment, which he also considered unsound and, indeed, in [1985] (pp. 321-325), he reverted to his original position, arguing that actualism does indeed entail serious actualism after all. Michael Bergmann [1996] proffered a new argument for the entailment, which led to the exchange Hudson [1997] and Bergmann [1999]. See also Yagisawa [2005] for an argument against serious actualism and the reply by Stephanou [2007].

7. Unfortunately, for reasons rooted ultimately in the monumental work of Gödel [1931], a first-order logic cannot provide a completely decidable mechanism for determining validity. More exactly, while it is true that, if a formula is valid, one can eventually find a proof of it in the logic, there is in general no proof theoretic way to determine that a formula is invalid.

8. In the one case, then, a trace, or vestige, of something x is identical to x while in the other it is not. Not that anything hangs on the matter, as the usage here is a stipulation, but the ordinary meaning of ‘trace’ arguably supports both. On the one hand, a trace of something can be that very thing, albeit in an attenuated state — one might say that the embers of a once roaring blaze are but a trace of the fire, but they arguably constitute that very fire in a late stage of its existence. On the other hand, a trace of something may be no more than a sign of that object. Thus, a criminal who leaves some of his DNA behind at a crime scene is said to have left a trace of himself but, while (twins excepted) the trace is associated uniquely with the perpetrator, it is obviously distinct from him or her.

9. A term (i.e., a variable or individual constant) τ is substitutable for a variable α in a formula φ just in case τ is an individual constant or no free of occurrence of α in φ is in the scope of a quantifier occurrence of the form ∀τ or ∃τ.)

10. McMichael does not actually use the idea of inclusion relative to an argument place. Rather, I have introduced it to simplify the presentation of the theory. It is an equivalent mechanism and so has no impact on the theory's content. McMichael's own account relies on an elegant, but conceptually more challenging permutation mechanism that shuffles argument places in relations.

11. For the sake of simplicity, we ignore temporal qualifications in these examples that would be needed in a fully accurate account, e.g., [being condemned to death as an adult].

12. As indicated, order matters in our representation of relations: the binary role that Boswell bears to Johnson is distinct from the binary role that Johnson bears to Boswell, the latter, of course, being the converse of the former.

13. More exactly, given McMichael's revised understanding of de re possibility, it means that it is possible that R1 be exemplified without any role accessible to b's role @(b) being exemplified.)

14. Things are a bit more subtle than this, for to have an intended* model, one also needs to do a little more to reflect the modal facts expressed by means of iterated modalities. See Menzel (1990) for details.

Notes to the Supplement: Classical Possibilism and Lewisian Possibilism

1. Cf. Sextus Empiricus [1949] (10.218, SVF 2.331): “The Stoics want to place above this [the existent] yet another, more primary genus…. Some Stoics consider ‘something’ the first genus, and I shall add the reason why they do. In nature, they say, some things exist, some do not exist. But nature includes even those which do not exist — things which enter the mind, such as Centaurs, giants, and whatever else falsely formed by thought takes on some image despite lacking substance.”

2. To quote Prior further, according to the doctrine of ampliatio,

…what things a general term can stand for depends in part on the tense or mood of the verb with which it is used. In ‘Some man is running’, the word ‘man’ can stand for any man now existing; but in ‘Some man will be running’ it can stand also for a man who merely will exist, and in ‘Some man could be running’ it can stand for a man who merely could exist….

3. For instance, in the Preface of [1903] (p. xvii) he writes: “In pure mathematics, actual objects in the world of existence will never be in question….”

4. In Russell [1903], §430, for example, he writes that “there seems to be no true proposition of which there is any sense in which it might be said to be false…. What is true is true; what is false is false; and concerning fundamentals there is nothing more to be said.” See also Russell [1904], 208-9.

5. Indeed, van Inwagen [2008] (pp. 40-41) denies outright that Lewis is a possibilist in any sense.

Notes to the Supplement: The Simplest Quantified Modal Logic

1. A term (i.e., a variable or individual constant) τ is substitutable for a variable α in a formula φ just in case τ is an individual constant or no free of occurrence of α in φ is in the scope of a quantifier occurrence of the form ∀τ or ∃τ.)

Copyright © 2008 by
Christopher Menzel <>

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