Supplement to Actualism

An Account of Abstract Possible Worlds

As an example of actualistically acceptable abstract worlds, we draw chiefly upon Plantinga's account. In this account, we replace the possibilist idea of merely possible worlds with that of a certain type of state of affairs (alternatively, a certain type of proposition) which exists but fails to obtain (alternatively, fails to be true). Where propositions are said to be true or false, states of affairs are said to obtain or not. Say that one state of affairs s includes another s′ if and only if it is not possible that s obtain without s′ obtaining. Importantly, note that a state of affairs can exist without obtaining, just as a proposition can exist without being true. States of affairs, like propositions, are taken to be necessary beings on this account.

We can now define several critical notions:

  • A state of affairs w is a world just in case it is possible that w includes all and only states of affairs that obtain.
  • For any state of affairs s and world w, s obtains at w just in case w includes s.
  • A world w is actual just in case w obtains.
  • An individual x exists in world w just in case the state of affairs x's existing obtains at w.

This theory is then to be applied as follows. The everyday claim ‘it is possible that there are Aliens’ can then be analyzed as: the state of affairs There are Aliens obtains at some world (i.e., there is some world, in the above sense of ‘world’, which implies that there are Aliens). If there are no Aliens, then no such world obtains. Similarly, an ordinary claim of the form ‘it is necessary that p’ can be analyzed as: p obtains at every possible world. Thus, in this first stage of the actualist treatment of modality, ordinary possibility claims are analyzed in terms of actually existing states of affairs. This step is, therefore, consistent with Thesis (A). So far, no possible-but-nonactual objects have been introduced for the analysis of modal claims.

In putting forward this theory, the actualist takes herself to be replacing an obscure distinction between two modes of being — possible existence and actual existence — with an intelligible distinction. This distinction is replaced by an allegedly clear distinction between two kinds of existing states of affairs — those that obtain and those that don't). That the latter distinction is more intelligible than the former ones is often just assumed by the actualist without argument. This invites the question whether there are cogent arguments for this assumption. However, again, we will not pursue this question here.

Furthermore, in putting forward this theory, the actualist has not invoked any objects which have such modal properties as being a possible million carat diamond, being a possible talking donkey, being a possible Alien, etc. The ‘worlds’ of the actualist do in fact have modal properties and the fact that they do is essential for them to do the work they have to do in the theory. A possible world is a state of affairs that could be such that it includes all and only states of affairs that obtain. Postulating objects with modal properties such as this seems less objectionable to the actualist than postulating objects with the modal properties described at the beginning of this paragraph. This of course invites a certain question, namely, just why is it less objectionable to have objects with the latter modal properties than the former one. But, again, we will not pursue this question here.

This latter point about the actualist theory of worlds brings us to the second step of their treatment of modality, namely, how to analyze ordinary modal claims that seem to require such possible individuals as possible million carat diamonds, possible talking donkeys, possible Aliens, etc. For the remainder of this essay, then, we assume that some actualist theory of worlds is viable and therefore concentrate our energies solely on the problems that arise in connection possible individuals rather than possible worlds.

Copyright © 2008 by
Christopher Menzel <cmenzel@tamu.edu>

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