Notes to Akan Philosophy of the Person

1. The Akan, of course, are not unique in distinguishing between persons and humans. In the United States, for instance, corporations are treated as ‘artificial persons’ under the law and given many of the same protections granted to so-called ‘natural persons’ by the Constitution.

2. It should here be noted that personhood is an open-ended climb, since one can theoretically climb higher and higher and higher in the achievement of personhood. There is, however, also a downward limit to how far a person can fall, since one cannot descend below the level at which one becomes a mere human being with certain minimum irreducible rights and responsibilities.

3. Similar considerations underlie the distinction between adults and future full persons with respect to the opprobrium directed at adults of able bodied and normal functioning mind who failed to pull their weight but not to infants still regarded as preparing for entry into personhood.

4. Wiredu, of course, will not deny that the status of the deceased is relevant. However, he will complement this statement by asserting that it will also depend on how the individual obtain that status.

5. Gyekye's position is motivated at least in part by his concern that the ‘fetishization’ of communal life in Akan (and Africa in general) comes at the expense of individuals rights.

6. For more on how to deal with someone of erratic behavior, see Wiredu, Cultural Universals and Particulars, 130–33.

Copyright © 2006 by
Ajume Wingo <>

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