Notes to Anaphora

1. For example, the beginning of the entry for “anaphora” in the Supplement to the Macmillan Encyclopedia of Philosophy (London: Macmillan, 1996) reads

The study of anaphora (from Greek, “carry back”) is the study of the ways in which occurrences of certain expressions, particularly pronouns, depend for their interpretations upon the interpretations of occurrences of other expressions.

And in The Concise Oxford Dictionary of Linguistics (Peter Matthews, New York: Oxford University Press, 1997), the entry for “anaphora” begins “The relation between a pronoun and another element, in the same or in an earlier sentence, that supplies its referent”.

2. Some people also treat presupposition as a kind of anaphora, giving a uniform treatment to both phenomena. See the SEP entry on presupposition.

3. One difference though is that the quantifiers of standard first order logic are unrestricted, whereas natural language quantifiers like “every man” are restricted (here by the nominal “man”). Still, it is easy enough to introduce a first order language with restricted quantifiers that bind variables. The pronouns in sentences like (2) and (12) function just like the bound variables of such a language.

4. Sometimes philosophers and linguists consider conjunctions of sentences like those in (7) and (8) rather than considering the two sentence discourses. For example, Evans (1977) considers conjunctions such as “Few MPs came to the party but they had a marvelous time”. The reasons for thinking the pronouns in the second conjuncts of such conjunctions are not bound variables or referring expressions are the same as the reasons for thinking this about the pronouns in the second sentences of (7) and (8). Hence we shall talk only of discourses like (7) and (8). Also, henceforth we shall take the intended anaphoric relations in the examples to be obvious (as they are); and unless otherwise indicated we are only considering the readings of the examples on which the intended anaphoric relations obtain.

5. Evans argued that a bound variable treatment also gets the truth conditions wrong for cases such as “John owns some sheep and Harry vaccinates them” (as well as for the two sentence discourse corresponding to this conjunction). Wilson (1984) argues, correctly in our view, that Evans is mistaken about this. But that the account of pronouns with quantifier antecedents in other sentences (or conjunctions) as bound variables gets the truth conditions wrong for some cases (e.g., (8)) is enough to reject it.

6. Of course, one could argue that different quantifiers have different capacities for how far their scopes extend, and that this explains the discrepancy between (7) and (8), and (9) and (10). So far as we know, no one has defended this view, and we think they are right not to.

7. We believe that considerations of this general sort were first raised in Davies 1981: 172–173. They are also discussed in Wilson 1984 and Soames 1989.

8. These patterns, along with many others, are, to our knowledge, first observed by Lauri Karttunen (1976).

9. So far as we know, such sentences were introduced into the contemporary literature in Geach 1962. The term “donkey anaphora” arose from the fact that Geach used the indefinite “a donkey” in his examples, as we do above.

10. The name is due to Kamp. Heim (1982) calls one formulation of her view file change semantics and that term is sometimes used in the literature for Heim’s version of DRT.

11. The various hedges above (scare quotes around “logical form”), here (“in effect can be represented as”) and below are due to the fact that Heim and Kamp implement the feature of DRT being described in different ways. For example, in the present case Heim (on one formulation) assigns logical forms to sentences and in these logical forms indefinites always have novel indices. Pronouns anaphoric on an indefinite share its index. Indices on indefinites and indexed pronouns function as variables. By contrast, Kamp constructs discourse representation structures for discourses, and truth is defined over these. An indefinite introduces a new discourse referent into the discourse representation structure for the discourse it is in. And a pronoun anaphoric on the indefinite gets linked with the discourse referent the indefinite introduced. But Heim’s and Kamp’s methods are both ways of insuring that the truth of a discourse like (27) requires that some one thing satisfy both the predicative material in the indefinite and the sentence containing it, and the predicative material the anaphoric pronoun is combined with.

12. Actually, the claim that the truth of (26) requires every donkey owning woman to beat every donkey she owns is somewhat controversial. This is discussed in section 4 below. The literature, to our knowledge, doesn”t discuss the same controversy about the truth conditions of conditional donkey anaphora like (25), but to us it seems the same phenomena is present.

13. We assume that “every \(x,y (\Phi(x,y)) (\Psi(x,y))\)”, where “\(\Phi(x,y)\)” and “\(\Psi(x,y)\)” are (possibly) complex predicates that may contain free occurrences of “x” and “y”, is true just in case every assignment to “x” and “y” that makes “\(\Phi(x,y)\)” true also makes “\(\Psi(x,y)\)” true.

14. The notion of unselective binding (for adverbs of quantification) was first proposed by David Lewis (1975).

15. For example, Montague (more or less) assigned each syntactic constituent a model theoretic interpretation and the interpretation of a syntactically complex expression was a function of the interpretations of its parts. DRT, by contrast, doesn’t even assign interpretations to parts of sentences.

16. Groenendijk and Stokhof write the clause as follows: \[[[\exists x\Phi ]]= \{\langle g,h\rangle \hspace{3pt} | \hspace{3pt} \exists k: k[x]g \mathbin{\&} \langle k,h\rangle \in [[\Phi]]\},\] (where \(k[x]g\) is a sequence that differs from g at most on x).

17. As Groenendijk and Stokhof write it: \[[[\Phi \mathbin{\&} \Psi]]= \{\langle g,h\rangle \hspace{3pt}|\hspace{3pt} \exists k: \langle g,k\rangle \in [[\Phi]] \mathbin{\&} \langle k,h\rangle \in [[\Psi]]\}\]

18. That we only look at pairs \(\langle h,h\rangle\) means that conditionals are “externally static”, and so cannot affect the interpretation of expressions outside of them, unlike conjunctions. This explains the following contrast: “A man came in and he was happy. He was rich.”; #“If a man came in, he was happy. He was rich.”

19. But not outside: it is externally static, which explains the infelicity of the following: #“Every woman who ones a donkey beats it. It is in pain.”

20. See, for example, Chierchia (1995) and Kanazawa (1994a,b). See also Groenendijk and Stokhof (1990) and Muskens (1991) for dynamic semantics in a Montagovian framework.

21. Chierchia (1995) favors a dynamic approach, but allows that anaphoric pronouns can function as definite descriptions as well (see pps. 110–122, and section 3.3 below). He also suggests that Geach Discourses (see above) can be handled assuming the anaphoric pronouns in them are functioning as definite descriptions. So perhaps he would invoke this mechanism to get the reading discussed above for the second sentence of (18). But this is to invoke another mechanism in addition to the one invoked by dynamic approaches to explain the anaphora in (18) on the reading in question. And that is the point we are making in the text.

22. In addition to dynamic semantic theories, some recent work uses features of dynamic semantic theories, such as treating anaphoric pronouns as variables, keeping track of discourse referents, and having indefinite antecedents introduce discourse referents or variables without incorporating the dynamics (i.e., context change) into the semantics. See for example Cresswell (2002), Breheny (2004), Roberts (2003, 2004), Dekker (2004, 2012), and Lewis (2012).

23. In particular, Davies (1981) holds that pronouns anaphoric on singular indefinite noun phrases (“Mary owns a dog. It…”) “go proxy” for definite descriptions (1981: 166–176). He holds a broadly Russellian theory of definite descriptions, and views them as quantificational (1981: 151–152). He suggests that in relative clause donkey sentences, anaphoric pronouns “go proxy” for number neutral descriptions (which Neale calls numberless), and so explains why “Every man who owns a donkey beats it.” (allegedly) requires every man who owns donkeys to beat all the donkeys he owns in the same way Neale does (see 1990: 175). And finally, the options Davies considers regarding how to understand the notion that anaphoric pronouns “go proxy for” or “are interpreted as” definite descriptions (1981: 174) appear to be precisely those considered by Neale (1990: 184).

24. Actually, Neale mentions another factor as well. Concerning the sentence “Every man who has a daughter thinks she is the most beautiful girl in the world” Neale writes:

…it is arguable that a singular [Russellian] interpretation of the pronoun is preferred. A reasonable explanation is that immediate linguistic context, and lexical and background knowledge, conspire to defeat the numberless interpretation. (In the normal run of things, there cannot be two most beautiful girls in the world.). (1990: 238)

We suppress this factor affecting which reading an anaphoric pronoun has. For in the examples we consider in which an anaphoric pronoun lacks a numberless reading there are no factors such as the impossibility of there being two most beautiful girls in the world that would “defeat” the numberless reading.

25. Note that nothing like the impossibility of there being two most beautiful girls in the world is present in this case to defeat the numberless reading. Sarah could beat more than one donkey and the Camaro driver could use more than one eight track player. See previous note.

26. A little more simplified, the basic logical form of the conditional donkey sentence is [[always [if a man owns a donkey]] [he man] beats [it donkey]]

27. Of course, DRT, dynamic semantics, CDQ, and these D-types approaches give different accounts of what these factors are and how they interact.

28. The CDQ account of discourse anaphora was originally motivated by a felt analogy between the semantics of discourse anaphora and the semantics of “instantial terms” that figure in quantificational reasoning in natural languages and in derivations of systems of natural deduction for first order predicate logic. An example of an instantial term in natural language would be occurrences of “n” when one supposes that n is an arbitrary prime number and on the basis of subsequently establishing the claim that n is F, one concludes that all prime numbers are F. Or given that some prime number is F, one might let n be “a prime that is F” and go on to establish certain other claims “about” n. In systems of natural deduction, instantial terms are the singular terms that are introduced in applications of existential instantiation and eliminated in applications of universal generalization. CDQ has been applied to the instantial terms of a certain range of systems of natural deduction (see King 1991). In these applications, occurrences of formulas containing instantial terms in derivations are assigned truth conditions. The truth conditions assigned depend on the structure of the derivation containing the occurrence of the formula. Thus given an occurrence of a formula A in derivation D, one defines the truth conditions of A in context c, where c encodes the structural features of derivation D that are relevant to the truth conditions of the occurrence of A in D. The idea underlying the application of CDQ to instantial terms is that such terms are quantifier-like expressions of generality, where the precise nature of that generality (e.g., universal or existential force, etc.) is determined by features of the natural language argument or derivation of a system of natural deduction in which the instantial term occurs.

29. The idea that definites involve some sort of familiarity is common in the literature. See for example Heim (1982).

30. Kanazawa (1994b) discusses how the monotonicity properties of the determiner on the wide scope quantifier in a relative clause donkey sentence (“Every”, “Most” and “No” in (55)/(56) a–c respectively) affect whether a universal or existential reading for the sentence is favored. Though Kanazawa admits that other factors also contribute to making one or the other reading favored in particular cases (see 1994b: 124), he claims that certain monotonicity properties of the determiners on the wide scope quantifier result in only one reading being possible. Thus he claims that when the wide scope quantifier has a determiner that is upward monotone on both arguments (e.g., “some”), only the weak reading is possible (1994b: 120, 124). We agree with this. However, Kanazawa also claims that when the wide scope quantifier has a determiner that is monotone down on both arguments (e.g., “no”) only the weak reading is possible (1994b: 120, 124). Though such sentences favor weak readings, sentences like (56c) cast doubt on the claim that they only allow weak readings. In any case, the important point is that though Kanazawa is concerned with how monotonicity properties of the determiners on the wide scope quantifiers in relative clause donkey sentences affect which readings are favored or available, he agrees that in the general case factors other than such monotonicity properties affect which readings are favored. See also Geurts (2002) for interesting data on factors affecting which readings are favored for donkey sentences.

31. For example, Kanazawa (1994b) captures the strong and weak readings by defining a strong and a weak dynamic generalized quantifier for each determiner (see 1994b: 138). This appears to amount to claiming that determiners are ambiguous. However, Kanazawa appears to take himself to be simply “modeling” the readings of donkey sentences and not actually proposing a semantics. Thus, in introducing his dynamic predicate logic with generalized quantifiers, he consistently talks of using the framework to “model” or “represent readings of” donkey sentences (see 1994b: 132, 137, 138, 139); and after discussing the framework, he writes:

So far, we have not proposed any concrete model of the mechanism that assigns interpretations to donkey sentences. Although it would not be difficult to extract a compositional semantics from my treatment of donkey sentences in dynamic predicate logic with generalized quantifiers, our interest in this paper is not in finding the right set of compositional semantic rules that give donkey sentences the interpretation that they actually have (in the default case). (1994b: 150)

But the point is that if one were to turn Kanazawa’s approach into a semantics, it seems that it would posit an ambiguity in determiners. Kanazawa himself seems to recognize this when, in discussing Chierchia’s approach and contrasting it with his own, he writes “So he [Chierchia] shifts the locus of ambiguity from the determiner to the pronoun” (1994b: 155). On the other hand, as Kanazawa’s remarks just suggested, Chierchia (1995) attempts to capture the universal and existential readings by positing an ambiguity in the pronouns in donkey sentences. As mentioned in section 3.3, Chierchia holds that such pronouns are interpreted either as dynamically bound variables or d-type (descriptive) pronouns (see 1995: 110–122). Chierchia denies that the (alleged) fact that donkey pronouns can be interpreted in these two ways amounts to postulating an ambiguity in these pronouns (see 1995: 117). However, we don’t find what he says on this matter persuasive.

32. As does the question of whether conditional donkey sentences seem to manifest both strong and weak readings.

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Karen S. Lewis <>

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