Supplement to Anomalous Monism

Homonomic and Heteronomic Generalizations

Davidson organizes his discussion of Anomalous Monism around what he portrays as an exhaustive distinction between ‘homonomic’ and ‘heteronomic’ generalizations (Davidson 1970, 219). As we shall see in this section, it is extremely problematic for the wider purposes of establishing Anomalous Monism. Ultimately it is best to set it aside and instead focus simply on the related (but by no means identical) distinction between strict and ceteris paribus laws.

With regard to the distinction, Davidson writes:

[o]n the one hand, there are generalizations whose positive instances give us reason to believe the generalization itself could be improved upon by adding further provisos and conditions stated in the same general vocabulary as the original generalization. Such a generalization points to the form and vocabulary of the finished law: we may say that it is a homonomic generalization. On the other hand, there are generalizations which when instantiated may give us reason to believe there is a precise law at work, but one that can be stated only by shifting to a different vocabulary. We may call such generalizations heteronomic. (Davidson 1970, 219)

Davidson's claim is that generalizations in which mental properties figure can only be heteronomic, not homonomic, and that therefore there can be no strict psychological or psychophysical laws. In the passage above, Davidson maintains that the finished (i.e., strict) laws towards which both homonomic and heteronomic generalizations (both of which are ceteris paribus—see further below) point must be stated in a homogeneous vocabulary. (This reading of the passage is supported by Davidson's subsequent remark (Davidson 1970, 222) explaining the heteronomic character of psychophysical generalizations by appeal to various reasons for mental anomalism. This remark would not make sense if heteronomic statements could be made strict while incorporating both vocabularies.) It is important to see that this is equivalent to ruling out, by sheer definition, the possibility of heterogeneously formulated strict laws. This is extremely problematic, however, because it amounts to defining away the possibility of strict psychophysical laws—strict laws formulated in heterogeneous vocabulary. And that appears to beg one of the central questions that Davidson is investigating.

To see this, notice first that, according to Davidson's actual formulation, neither homonomic nor heteronomic generalizations are strict. Each of these generalizations is a ceteris paribus generalization at the time when its status is under consideration, and each points in the direction of a different sort of strict law relative to the original vocabulary in which it is formulated. The sort of strict law pointed to depends upon whether a change in vocabulary is required in articulating the conditions gestured at in the ceteris paribus clause. Davidson is quite clear on this: the homonomic/heteronomic distinction is made “within the category of the rude rule of thumb” (Davidson 1970, 219; emphasis added). Since homonomic ceteris paribus generalizations are thus possible, the distinctions between homonomic/heteronomic generalizations, on the one hand, and strict/ ceteris paribus laws, on the other, are not the same; not all ceteris paribus generalizations are heteronomic. (Most commentators have failed to see this point; for examples, see Fodor 1989, McLaughlin 1985, and Hancock 2001. For extended discussion, see Yalowitz 1998a.)

The central question now concerns the status of heterogeneously formulated strict laws. It would seem that Davidson's attack on the possibility of strict psychophysical laws is an attack on the possibility of (one form of) strict laws formulated in a heterogeneous vocabulary. But we have already observed that Davidson's own formulation of the homonomic/heteronomic distinction as exhaustive makes it difficult to see how the possibility of heterogeneously formulated strict laws could even be at issue, since they appear to be ruled out by definition. But there are a number of reasons against proceeding in this way. If we assumed the exhaustive nature of the homonomic/heteronomic distinction, then the interaction principle would guarantee the heteronomicity of generalizations that include psychological predicates, and thus mental anomalism. As a result, no independent argument for mental anomalism would be required; this holds for monism as well.

After all, as we have already seen, the interaction principle tells us that mental events causally interact with physical events, and this means that homonomicity is already ruled out—something other than just psychological vocabulary is needed in explicating psychological generalizations of the form ‘ceteris paribus, M1 & M2 → M3’. With heteronomicity the only remaining option, we could then directly draw the conclusion that the only strict laws that can cover mental event-tokens must be stated in an entirely different vocabulary. This is equivalent to mental anomalism. Furthermore, monism follows as well, since causally interacting mental events must be covered by some strict law (the cause-law principle), and the only candidate laws remaining contain no mental vocabulary—therefore, mental events must instantiate whatever properties are capable of formulating such laws. Now, as we have seen (2.3), it is quite uncontroversial that there can be no strict, purely psychological laws, and the interaction principle expresses this. However, Davidson's homonomic/ heteronomic framework would allow us to draw directly from this uncontroversial point the far more controversial and interesting doctrines of psychophysical anomalism and monism, with no required route through the anomalism principle. That is too quick, and anyway inconsistent with Davidson's own explicit attempt at independent arguments for this principle. Indeed, on this way of thinking one cannot even formulate the question about the possibility of strict psychophysical laws. The only available formulation that is coherent and somewhat relevant is: ‘are generalizations in which psychological predicates figure homonomic or heteronomic?’ But this does not succeed in raising a question about strict psychophysical laws. It asks only whether there can be strict, purely psychological laws, or (barring that) concludes that there are no strict generalizations in which psychological predicates can figure at all. Clearly something has gone wrong, and the purported exhaustiveness of the homonomic/heteronomic distinction is the culprit.

What this suggests is that an argument is needed to rule out the possibility of heterogeneously formulated strict laws, otherwise the question of the possibility of strict psychophysical laws has simply been begged. And this means that we cannot assume the exhaustiveness of the homonomic/ heteronomic distinction at the start. In the main text, then, we set aside Davidson's use of this distinction in our discussion of Anomalous Monism, and instead simply focus on the distinction between strict and ceteris paribus laws, which is at the very core of Davidson's discussion.

Copyright © 2012 by
Steven Yalowitz <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free

The SEP would like to congratulate the National Endowment for the Humanities on its 50th anniversary and express our indebtedness for the five generous grants it awarded our project from 1997 to 2007. Readers who have benefited from the SEP are encouraged to examine the NEH’s anniversary page and, if inspired to do so, send a testimonial to