Supplement to Anomalous Monism

Supervenience and the Explanatory Primacy of the Physical

As we have seen, Davidson never argues for either the supervenience of the mental on the physical or the explanatory primacy of the physical. Here we consider some reasons for these claims that are consistent with the spirit of Anomalous Monism. One reason for the primacy claim is that while every mental event is physical, not all physical events are mental. Another is that, with Anomalous Monism already established, the only strict laws are strict physical laws. And given causal closure of the physical (see the supplement on Causal Closure of the Physical in the Argument for Monism), every event that occurs must then have a physical explanation. These points motivate a kind of explanatory primacy to physical properties—they always explain the occurrence of physical events, which is not true of mental properties. However, none of these reasons motivates the sort of explanatory relation between physical and mental properties expressed in the supervenience claim (indeed, Davidson 1970, 214 describes these features of the physical as ‘bland’ and not indicative of any significant ontological bias towards the physical). Typically, supervenience claims are driven by the thought that one can only affect the higher-order (in this case mental) properties of an event or object by affecting its lower-order (physical) properties. One creates a beautiful statue by altering the physical properties of the marble; therefore, aesthetic properties supervene on physical properties. It appears that Davidson has in mind this sort of picture of the relation between physical and mental properties when he maintains that physical properties “determine” mental ones, and that the latter are “strongly dependent” on the former (Davidson 1973a, 253). But it is difficult to see how this claim is motivated in Davidson's framework. Davidson offers no argument in favor of supervenience, and although he does think that it is required of any acceptable theory of the relation between the mental and the physical (Davidson 1993, 9), he never explains this requirement.

One possible explanation that is close to Davidson's concerns is the following. If an event involving a change in mental properties occurs (e.g., a person comes to believe something), there must be some physical explanation of that event. Davidson's causal extensionalism would lead him to say that what is explained is the event of coming to believe, but under a physical description. (And, as discussed in the supplement on Causal Closure of the Physical in the Argument for Anomalous Monism, causal closure of the physical holds that all physical events have physical explanations.) So the physical explanation is not of that change in mental properties directly. But the physical explanation does concern a physical change that coincides with the change in mental properties. Without some sort of supervenience claim, this coincidence would be merely that—a brute fact that could just as well be otherwise. It would be perfectly possible for that exact same physical change to be accompanied by a completely different mental change or even no mental change at all. In considering the mental change, absolutely no explanatory significance could be accorded to the physical change. But since many mental changes (i.e., actions) involve overt bodily movements for which physical explanations are possible, this would threaten to bifurcate completely the explanations of bodily movements and actions; the former would have nothing to do with the latter, which seems quite counterintuitive and also surprising given Davidson's claim that actions are bodily movements (Davidson 1971, 49).

Continuing this line of thinking, a related reason for the supervenience claim, not mentioned by Davidson, is that it can otherwise appear completely miraculous that the ceteris paribus generalizations in psychology and the strict physical laws can so often converge in their predictions and explanations of events (see Cussins 1992, sect. 3, for discussion). If there are no explanatory relations between mental and physical properties, how is it possible that the psychological generalization that some individual will, given that he has certain reasons, open an umbrella on a certain occasion, predict an event that is also (under a different description) predicted by the physical laws? Such convergences occur countless times each day, but can appear to be only repeated miraculous coincidences unless there are explanatory relations between the mental and physical domains. Supervenience is one way of filling this explanatory void.

One final rationale for positing supervenience is that it can provide a criterion for distinguishing between those properties of an event that can play a role in genuine explanations and those that cannot. Why, for example, do many reject astrological explanations of human behavior as genuinely explanatory? On this view, it would be because astrological properties do not supervene on physical properties—there is no dependency or explanatory relation between the two. (For related discussion, see the supplement on Explanatory Epiphenomenalism.)

Copyright © 2012 by
Steven Yalowitz <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free

The SEP would like to congratulate the National Endowment for the Humanities on its 50th anniversary and express our indebtedness for the five generous grants it awarded our project from 1997 to 2007. Readers who have benefited from the SEP are encouraged to examine the NEH’s anniversary page and, if inspired to do so, send a testimonial to