Supplement to Aristotle's Psychology

Controversies Surrounding Aristotle's Theory of Perception

The most immediate difficulty for Aristotle's approach to perception concerns his claim that in sense perception the relevant sensory faculty becomes like the object it perceives. (This claim is reflected in clause (iii) of the general analysis of Aristotelian perception offered in the main article.) When he says that “what can perceive is potentially such as the object of sense is actually” (De Anima ii 5, 418a3-4), Aristotle seems to commit himself to a claim to the effect that a sense organ in one way or another becomes like its object when it perceives. The difficulty concerns understanding precisely how this likeness is supposed to be envisaged. In the abstract, it is easy to understand this claim in a variety of different ways. An ultimate evaluation of Aristotle's theory of perception will need first to decide what he intends.

At one end of the spectrum, some commentators have understood Aristotle to intend something utterly plain and literal. What it takes for a person to perceive is for him to be outfitted with the appropriate organs and to have those organs actualized on specific occasions by ambient perceptual qualities. Appropriate organs are those with, among other things, an ability to share by coming to exemplify the sensible qualities which they are structured to receive. So, for example, on this approach a subject perceives redness when he has an eye made of suitably gelatinous stuff such that when it is exposed to a color in its environment it becomes, in virtue of this exposure, itself red. That is, on the literalist interpretation, the sense organs become literally, and non-representationally, the colors they perceive. More exactly, according to proponents of this approach, the eye jelly, the matter of the inner eye, itself becomes red. So, likeness amounts to shared-property exemplification. Just as a grey fence becomes like a white fence when white paint is applied to it, precisely because it is made to exemplify whiteness, so an eye becomes like its object in perception when it is made to be like it, which occurs when it is made to exemplify the quality of its object. The eye, for instance, simply comes to exemplify the colors present in the objects its field.

Commentators who favor this approach, including most notably Sorabji (1974), with whom the interpretation originated in contemporary times and who has been its most adept proponent, have been able to amass textual evidence suggesting that Aristotle believes that some such literal alteration occurs in perception. Detractors have not found this commitment in the passages adduced and have in turn pointed to passages with, evidently, just the opposite purport. So, one exegetical question concerns whether Aristotle clearly expresses the view that each of the sense organs actually exemplifies the sensible qualities experienced in sense perception (the eyes taking on colors, the ears pinging sounds, the nose piquant odors, and so forth). One further philosophical question left largely unaddressed by this literature concerns whether Aristotle can be supposed to believe that literal alteration of the sort described is sufficient for perception. That seems an odd and unsustainable claim, since, for example, my flesh can become warm without my perceiving warmth; indeed, the view thus interpreted seems to entail that I perceive every sensible quality in whose presence I find myself, with no allowance for the phenomena of selective attention, inattention, distraction, and the like. This is because in its purest form this interpretation seems to make perception an almost completely passive affair, something which occurs automatically whenever the ingredients of perception share a discrete locale. If, on the other hand, literal likeness is to be understood as only a necessary condition for form assimilation, then the original question about likeness re-emerges. What does it take for a sense organ to become like its object so as to suffice for perception? It cannot be the mere shared exemplification of some property. What then is required for perception in addition to becoming literally like?

Partly in view of these sorts of questions, and partly because they have not been persuaded by the textual evidence offered on behalf of the literalist interpretation, other commentators have pursued non-literalist alternatives. Indeed, non-literalist interpretations extend at least as far back as Brentano (1867), who had been inspired by the still earlier approach of Aquinas. Among the Greek commentators of late antiquity, Philoponus had already cast doubt on literalist interpretations (in DA 303.3). On one alternative approach, which may be called the intentionalist interpretation, the sense organs become like their objects without actually coming to exemplify the sensible qualities perceived. Instead, they become like them by coming to symbolize them in one way or another. In its simplest form, this approach regards the likeness involved in perception as akin to the likeness obtaining between a house and its blue print. If an architect has three blue prints on her desk, one of a house, one of a church, and one of a factory, then exactly one of them has the same structure as the house built according to its specifications. She may say with all linguistic propriety, when pointing to one set of the blueprints, ‘This one is a house.’ That set of blue prints ‘is a house’ not because it exemplifies the property of being a house, but because it somehow encodes that property. So, to begin, two things can be like each other with respect to the same property without their both exemplifying that property. As applied to Aristotle's theory of perception, then, a sensory organ can be made like its object, can receive its sensible property, without actually exemplifying that property. If this qualifies as a form of likeness for Aristotle, and it does seems to qualify as such since he is willing, for example, to speak of “the form in the craftsman's soul” as a way of someone's having a form which is then imparted to some matter made to exemplify it, then there is a reasonably clear way for Aristotle to articulate a doctrine of form reception which does not commit itself to literal property transference (cf. Metaphysics vii 7,1032a32, b5, b22).

There seem some obvious advantages to this approach, but also some difficulties. Among its advantages are that it does not saddle Aristotle with the dubious empirical claim that all organs, in all instances of perception, always come to exemplify the sensible qualities they perceive. (Do my eyes really become pinstriped when I see a dapper man's suit?) Second, this approach seems more obviously compatible with the phenomena of selective attention and the like. For on this view, a perceiver will not be made to encode just any sensible quality in whose presence she finds herself. Instead, she may be made like -- intentionally like -- only some subset of the properties in her immediate environment. Still, there are some costs. To begin, Aristotle does not expressly distinguish between the literal and intentional interpretations, and so does not argue determinately in favor of one over the other. Moreover, even granting the intentionalist approach, some of the same questions which arose regarding the literalist approach emerge again, in a new guise. If form reception and isomorphism are to be understood intentionally, then is form-reception thus construed sufficient for perception? If so, why is it that other entities which encode sensible properties do not perceive? If, however, form-reception thus construed is not sufficient for perception, then what more is necessary?

Copyright © 2010 by
Christopher Shields <Christopher.Shields@lmh.ox.ac.uk>

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