Notes to Antoine Arnauld

1.. Phillipe Sellier has said that this translation is “a literary and religious monument not unworthy of comparison with Luther's Bible in Germany and the King James version in England” (La Bible, ed. Philippe Sellier, p. xi).

2.. He adds an important qualification: “I say, principally, because nothing prevents one from using authorities in philosophical questions as well, if they are used for illustration rather than to decide the questions” (OA, 40:153).

3.. Letter to Pellison, A/1/7/196, cited by R. C. Sleigh, Jr. in Leibniz and Arnauld, a Commentary on Their Correspondence, Yale University Press, 1990, p. 31.

4.. Arnauld's use of “to represent” as a three-place relational verb (“X represents Y to Z”) meaning “to make known to” is consistent with Descartes' usage. It is often overlooked that Descartes used the two Latin verbs, “répresentare (to represent)” and “exhibere (to exhibit or to show)” interchangeably. A good example is the thirteenth paragraph of the Third Meditation. Here is a literal translation of the Latin: “To be sure, in so far as those ideas are only certain modes of thinking, I do not recognize any inequality among them and they all seem to proceed from me in the same way; but, in so far as one represents (representat) one thing, and another another, it seems that they are quite different from one another. For without doubt those that exhibit (exhibent) substance to me are something greater, and, so to speak, contain in themselves more objective reality, than those which represent (répresentant) only modes, or accidents, and on the other hand that [idea] through which I understand a supreme God, eternal, infinite, omniscient, omnipotent, and creator of all things outside of himself, has more objective reality in itself, than those through which finite substances are exhibited (exhibenter).” The two occurrences of “exhibere”, as well as the two occurrences of “répresentare” are translated by the French “representer” in the 1647 translation of the Meditations by the Duc de Luynes, and by the English “represent” in the English translation by Cottingham, et al.

5.. Forming this general rule from the certainty that one is thinking and alive is an example of the method of analysis, in which one arises to “general notions” from “the particular examination of the thing we are investigating” (Logic, p. 237).

6.. Regarding the proposition, “Everything contained in the clear and distinct idea of a thing can be truthfully affirmed of that thing,” the Port Royal Logic says, “This principle cannot be contested without destroying everything evident in human knowledge and establishing a ridiculous Pyrrhonism” (p. 247). But if this principle cannot or ought not be doubted, then the most famous problem Arnauld raised in the “Fourth Objections,” namely, “how the author avoids reasoning in a circle when he says that we are sure that what we clearly and distinctly perceive is true only because God exists” (Descartes, II, 150), does not arise within Arnauld's philosophy, and it is not clear whether he thought Descartes' attempted solution to the problem was successful.

7.. In his first letter to Descartes in 1648, Arnauld says, “What you have taught about the distinction of the mind from the body seems to me quite clear, perspicuous and divine” (OA, 38:68). It is well known that, in the “Fourth Objections” Arnauld had raised objections to Descartes' argument for the real distinction, but evidently he was satisfied with Descartes' reply.

8.. Examen d'un Ecrit qui a pour titre: Traité de l'essence du corps, et ce l'union de l'ame avec le corps contra la philosophie de M. Descartes, (OA 38:89–176). There is no known extant copy of Le Moine's treatise, but it is quoted fairly extensively by Arnauld. Hereinafter I will refer to this work by Arnauld simply as “Examen.” An improved edition of the work has been published: Texte revu par Emmanuel Faye, Librarie Arthème Fayard, 1999.

9.. In Part Two of Examen (OA, 38:100 ff.) Arnauld takes up the delicate question of whether Descartes' position on the essence of matter is consistent with the Catholic doctrine of transubstantiation. He begins by saying, “In order that the state of the question be better understood, I thought that I ought to report a place in the Recherche de la vérité, Book 3, Part 2, Ch. 8, N. 2, because it will show both what led to the definition of matter as extension and our disposition regarding the mysteries that it seems cannot be reconciled with that definition.” He then quotes five pages from the Recherche which give an account of the essence of matter which Arnauld knew perfectly well was not the same as the account given by Descartes.

10.. The state of the question is nicely summarized by Denis Moreau in “La 'Philosophie d'Antoine Arnauld': Un Bilan,” in Chroniques de Port-Royal,2011. See also Emmanuel Faye's article in Oxford Studies in Early Modern Philosophy.

11..On relations between Arnauld and Malebranche prior to the publication of Malebranche's Treatise of Nature and Grace, see Correspondance et actes (1638–1689), recueillis et présentés par André Robinet, vol. 18 of OM.

12.. For a detailed chronology of the controversy, see Moreau, 1999, p. 25–28.

13.. OM, 8:723–34. Malebranche cites the classic text, 1 Timothy, 2,4, for the doctrine that God wants all men to be saved.

14.. “By a practical will, I mean a decree or will executing a settled plan” (OM, 5:180).

15.. There is an ambiguity in Malebranche's use of the phrase “occasional cause.” Sometimes he uses it to refer to a thing on the occasion of whose action God causes another event to occur, and sometimes he uses it to refer to an event on the occasion of whose occurrence God causes another event to occur.

16.. The importance of this theme in Arnauld's criticism of Malebranche was brought home to me by a recent email exchange with Steven Nadler. For Nadler's interpretation, see his article, “Arnauld's God,” forthcoming.

17.. The very title of Arnauld's work, Reflexions philosophiques et théologiques sur le nouveau système de la Nature et de la Grace, contains the suggestion that Malebranche failed to follow a rule he himself took over from Augustine: “In theological matters, novelty has the character of error, and one ought to look down upon opinions for the simple reason that they are new and without foundation in tradition” (OA, 39:171).

18.. For a different approach to the connection between “the philosophical debate over ideas and the broader, and (to Arnauld) more important, theological debate,” see Nadler, 1989, pp. 179–84.

19.. Steven Nadler seems to disagrees on this point. Nadler says, “Everything points to Arnauld's God being an ultimately arbitrary deity who does not act for any reason at all--indeed, a deity who, in His being, transcends practical rationality altogether” [Nadler, 2008, p. 533].

20.. The phrase, “God can act externally only in order to procure an honor worthy of Himself” is Arnauld's paraphrase of #11 of the Troisième Eclaircissement, in which Malebranche's words are “ God can act only for Himself. If He wills to act, it is because He wills to procure an honor worthy of Himself.”

21.. Arnauld cites Summa Theologiae, I, 19, a. 2.

22.. On this point, see Sleigh 1990, p. 43–47.

23.. For support of Arnauld's interpretation, see Kremer 2000. Malebranche himself, in his last published work, says explicitly that the human soul is the “true” and “real” cause of its own free consent to “the motives that solicit the soul,” thus allowing an exception to his general principle that God is the only true efficient cause (Réflexions sur la Prémotion physique, OM, 16:42–43).

24.. Arnauld is referring to St. Thomas, Summa Theologiae, I, 19, 6, ad 1. Aquinas' Latin is “Magis potest dici velleitas, quam absoluta voluntas.”

25.. In the seventh of Neuf lettres de M. Arnauld contre R. P. Malebranche, published just before the first two books of Réflexions, Arnauld directly attacks Malebranche's account of grace efficace par elle-même. He says that Malebranche's position combines a truth of the Catholic faith with two errors, one of Luther, the other of Pelagius. The Catholic truth is that “God, through His grace, efficaciously forms in us a movement of love, which carries us toward Him and toward what we know is agreeable to Him, for that is the definition that St. Augustine gives of the grace of Jesus Christ, Inspiratio dilectionis, ut cognita sancta amore faciamus.” But Malebranche holds that this movement is neither free nor meritorious. Thus he falls into the error of Luther, who said that the love of God formed in us by grace is neither free nor meritorious. On the other hand, Malebranche holds that a person's free consent, the necessary ingredient, so to speak, which converts the grace of feeling into a free and meritorious love of God, is not produced by grace. In that way, he falls into the error of Pelagius, who said that since the actions of Christian piety are free and meritorious, they are not formed in us by grace.

Arnauld summarizes his analysis of Malebranche's position: “The cause of this monstrous mixture of truth and error is that you have distinguished what is from God and grace from what is from free will, as if one and the same movement of love could not be, and indeed is not, both from God who forms it in us efficaciously by the power of His grace, by making us will and love (en nous faisant vouloir & aimer) what He wants [us to will and love], and from free will, which loves and wills to love, being moved by grace” (OA, 39:113). He goes on to cite St. Thomas, who rejects the distinction “between what is from grace and what is from free will, as if they could not be the same” (Arnauld quotes from Summa Theologiae, I, 23, a. 5). The views lying behind this analysis of Arnauld's are discussed in Section VI below.

26.. For historical details, see the article, “Molinism,” by E. Vansteenberghe, in the Dictionnaire de Théologie Catholique. The best source in English is the translation of Molina's On Divine Foreknowledge, with a lengthy introduction and many notes by Alfred J. Freddoso . The Congregationes de Auxiliis were the most prolonged and famous of several disputes at the time about predestination, grace, and free will. Also important were the censure of seventy-nine propositions of Baius (Michel du Bay) in 1567 and 1579, and the censure of thirty-one propositions from the work of the Jesuit Lessius in 1587.

27.. Arnauld and Jansen disagreed with Bañez about when actual grace of the will is intrinsically efficacious. Arnauld and Jansen held that all actual grace of the will that results from the merits of Christ, by contrast with any such grace received by Adam and Eve before the Fall, is intrinsically efficacious with respect to what God proximately intends. Bañez, on the other hand, said that actual grace of the will is intrinsically efficacious in all cases in which its recipients cooperate with it, and in all such cases its efficacy is part of God's providential plan; otherwise it is intrinsically inefficacious.

28.. Arnauld adds that it would not be prudent to publicize the fact that he had “abandoned” Jansen on this point.

29.. Sleigh suggests that by “laws of nature” Arnauld may have meant to refer specifically to laws of motion (Sleigh, 1996, p. 174). Sleigh's suggestion is implausible, however, in light of Arnauld's statement in Examen that God voluntarily undertakes to cause in our soul perceptions of sensible qualities whenever the corresponding motions occur in the sensory organs “according to the laws he himself has established in nature.”

30.. In this document, Arnauld assembles various passages from St. Thomas in order to attribute to him the theory of grâce efficace par elle-même. Not surprisingly, Arnauld is unable to cite any passage in which St. Thomas explicitly commits himself to that theory.

31.. Arnauld comments that according to this text, “God does not move all men by grace. For [St. Thomas] explicitly affirms, that not all and always are men moved by grace, but only ‘specialiter, & interdum, & aliquos.’”

32.. See especially letters to Vuillaret (21 juin 1692, OA, 3:497–98) and to Bossuet (juillet 1694, OA, 3:661–65). In the letter to Vuillaret, Arnauld says, “Only seven or eight years ago I had the occasion to examine deeply the true opinion of St. Thomas … I collected everything he said about [human freedom] in his Summa, and it was on the basis of this collection that I wrote the little treatise de libertate.” This would put the composition of the treatise on freedom in 1684 or 1685, when Arnauld was at the point of publishing Réflexions. Arnauld also discusses his new theory in letters to Du Vaucel (3 août 1691, OA, 3:364–66), to Macaire (26 décembre 1691, OA, 3:417–20), and to Du Vaucel (9 janvier 1693, OA, 3:581–83).

A translation of Arnauld's Latin text, made by Pasquier Quesnel, is contained in OA, 10:614–624, under the title, De la Liberté de l'homme. The original Latin, Humanae libertatis notio, is published in Volume 6 of Oeuvres Philosophiques d'Arnauld, edited by Elmar J. Kremer and Denis Moreau, 2003; and also in Arnauld, Textes philosophiques, edited by Denis Moreau, 2001.

33.. In this life here below, one can love God or refrain from doing so, and hence one freely loves God or not, because one's apprehension of God is abstract: “Because the mind, during this life, knows God only abstractly … it can … attend to some perfections of God without thinking of others, as when misers, who consider God only as someone who can make them rich if He wants, can apprehend Him as their enemy if some extraordinary misfortune befalls them, and for that reason hate Him or at least not love Him” (Liberté, OA, 10:618–19).

34.. The the expressions “potestas ad opposita” and “facultas ad opposita” don't seem to be found in St. Thomas. Certainly neither expression occurs in the texts Arnauld assembled from the Summa Theologiae. However, the expression, “Voluntas se habet ad opposita in his quae ad finem ordinatur” occurs in I-IIae, 5, 4, ad 2, reproduced (but mistakenly identified as coming from Part I) in OA 10:629. Similar expressions occur in I, 19, 2, ad 2, and in I, 62, 8, obj. 2 and ad 2.

35.. In another late text, he adds that if God did not cause human beings to will freely, He would not be causing them to act in a meritorious way: “But what Scripture, the Fathers, and reason itself say about the power of God over the wills of men, assumes that He makes them will in a manner that is conformed to their nature, which is to will freely. Otherwise he would not make them accomplish His commandments or work their salvation, things that can only be done by free volitions” (OA, Instruction, 10:436).

36.. Michael Della Rocca has pointed out to me that Arnauld here comes very close to the position enunciated by Descartes in Principles of Philosophy, I, 41.

37.. Arnauld takes up similar examples in his letters to Mackaire, Bossuet, adding examples of a highly just judge offered a bribe and an extremely chaste woman whom someone attempts to seduce.

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Elmar Kremer <>

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