Supplement to Assertion

Belief and Assertion

By switching to a characterization of sincerity we can drop the appeal to rules. Does (SB), then, adequately characterize assertion? There are, in fact, problems both of sufficiency and necessity. Suppose it is reasonable to say that the speaker is insincere just if she intends to mislead the hearer about the facts by means of the assertion. In that case, an assertion can be insincere even though what is asserted is believed by the speaker. This can happen if the speaker deliberately tries to make the addressee infer something false. For instance, by reporting

A blue Lincoln Continental was parked outside Mrs Jones's house last night

I may deliberately mislead the addressee to believe that her husband has been unfaithful. It need not even be a case of implicature. This kind of indirect insincerity cannot be eliminated by requiring that the addressee not arrive at her belief by inference, since it is anyway supposed to be arrived at by inference from the observation of the utterance in the first place. So believing what one says is apparently not sufficient for an assertion to be sincere.

Conversely, I may deliberately lead the addressee to infer something true by means of asserting what I take to be false. For instance, knowing that you take me to be notoriously exaggerating, I can inform you by means of

Lisa danced with every guy at the party

that Lisa had danced with many of the guys at the party. I expect you to infer what is true from my assertion of a falsehood. Thus I am sincere in intending you to acquire a true belief, and it cannot be a necessary condition for an assertion to be sincere that the speaker believes what is said. Again the complexity of human psychology makes appeal to speaker intentions problematic.

Maybe, then, belief, just isn't essential to assertion. Maybe there simply is a statistical correlation between utterances being assertoric and the speakers believing what they say. This correlation may be more or less characteristic of assertion as an illocutionary type. However, one reason for thinking that it isn't merely a matter of statistics is suggested by Moore's paradox. Moore's paradox is exemplified by means of sentences such as

(1) It is raining and I don't believe it.

The paradoxical nature of an utterance of (1) is that it is distinctly odd and in some sense self-defeating, despite the fact that it may well be true. There have been broadly three kinds of strategy for dealing with the paradox, all three with the aim of deriving an underlying contradiction by means of some extra assumption (for an overview, see Sorensen 1988). The first, exemplified by G.E. Moore himself (1944), focuses on the nature of assertion, with the purpose of explaining the paradoxicality by appeal to some pragmatic property. In Moore's own case, the idea is that the speaker in some sense implies (but does not assert) that she believes what she asserts (Moore 1944, 175–76; cf. Moore 1966, 63). So by asserting (1) the speaker induces a contradiction between what she asserts and what she implies.

The first to offer a doxastic analysis of the paradox was Jaakko Hintikka (1962, 78–102). On Hintikka's account, believing what is expressed by (1) will involve the speaker in both believing that she believes that it is raining and believing that she does not believe that it is raining, thus having inconsistent beliefs. The problem with asserting (1) is that the speaker asserts what she cannot consistently believe. The argument, however, assumes the controversial BB principle, i.e. the principle that if a subject believes that p, she also believes that she believes that p.

According to a Wittgensteinian tradition, saying assertorically

I believe that it is raining

is a way of asserting that it is raining, albeit in a more guarded way. On this alternative, the speaker asserts both that it is raining and that it isn't.

On all three types of account, belief and/or representation of belief plays a central role. But it is not obvious that it must. For the sentence

It is raining but I have no evidence that it is raining

seems to be odd in pretty much the same way as (1), without mentioning belief, or any attitude at all. A possible explanation is that the truth of the second conjunct undercuts the information value of the first. An assertion that it is raining is potentially information that it is raining, i.e. provides evidence for the hearer about rain, but if the second premise is true, that potential is nullified, since the rain claim is asserted not to be based on evidence in the first place. Thus, if what is asserted is true, the first part is not informative. In fact, the standard Moorean paradox can be seen in this light, too: if the speaker doesn't believe that it is raining, the assertion isn't informative: it does not provide evidence for the hearer that it is raining, unless the speaker is an oracle, who reliably speaks the truth without the need of believing what she says.

Although belief is closely connected with assertion as an illouctionary type, it has proved difficult to nail down a relation that is instantiated in every assertoric act. If one accepts a negative conclusion here, two alternatives suggest themselves. The first is to interpret Frege's idea that assertion is a sign of judgment in a different way. We can think of what is communicated by an assertion as a propositional content together with a judgmental force or mode. This would be an abstract component rather than something mental. Judgment or belief is the mental attitude of the speaker that corresponds to judgmental force, but the correspondence need not be realized (i.e. the speaker need not believe). This suggestion has the advantage of avoiding the need to require particular mental states of the speaker, and the drawback of postulating new abstract entities.

The second alternative is to conclude that belief is simply the wrong state to relate to assertion. Maybe knowledge is more adequate.

Return to main text.

More on knowledge and assertion

Williamson adds an argument to show that inconclusive evidence (not sufficient for knowledge) is too weak for assertion. He considers an assertion about a lottery ticket (2000, 246–49). The draw has been held, but the result is not known to the speaker. Yet she asserts

(2) Your ticket did not win

on the basis of probabilistic evidence alone. Intuitively, as Williamson points out, the grounds for the assertion were inadequate, no matter how improbable it was that the ticket was in fact a winner. Williamson concludes that only knowledge is sufficient for an assertion to be warranted.

Very similar lottery ticket arguments have been given by Dudman (1992), DeRose (1996), and Hawthorne (2004, 21). DeRose, however, although he agrees that it is incorrect to make an assertion such as (2) in the lottery ticket case, has other examples to show that inconclusive evidence does not rule out assertibility. In DeRose's examples, there is an information source (a newspaper article) that has a small probability of being false but, according to DeRose's intuitions, still gives sufficient evidence for assertion.

Williamson does acknowledge (2000, 256–57) that most of our ordinary assertions are made on evidence that is not conclusive, e.g. the assertion

(3) It is snowing

made on the basis of observing falling white stuff that may have been put there by a film crew (Williamson 2000, 257). Such assertions are considered acceptable. He explains this by saying that it can be reasonable to assert that p on evidence that is inconclusive, because it can be reasonable for the speaker to believe that she knows that p even if she in fact doesn't.

However, it is not clear why the intuition of unacceptability in the case of (2) concerns warrant, or correctness in the strict sense, whereas the intuition of acceptability in the case of (3) concerns some other notion, such as reasonableness, rather than the other way around. On the alternative view, the unacceptability of (2) should be given another explanation than lack of proper warrant.

A third kind of argument comes from considering a knowledge variant of Moore's paradox:

(4) It is raining and I don't know that it is raining.

If asserting (4), the speaker cannot know what she asserts. For if she knows that p&q, she knows that p and she knows that q. And if she knows that q, then q. Applied to (4) this gives the result that the speaker knows that it is raining and also doesn't know that it is raining, i.e. an open contradiction. (This is a special case of the reasoning involved in the so-called knowability paradox, or Fitch's paradox; cf. Sorensen 1988 and Williamson 2000 for overviews).

The idea of the argument is that the strangeness of an assertion of (4) depends on the fact that such an assertion cannot be correct (warranted). That it cannot be correct is explained by the appeal to the idea of the self-representation as knower: I cannot correctly represent myself as knowing what I cannot know. Hence, on this view, I cannot correctly assert (4).

Return to main text.

Copyright © 2007 by
Peter Pagin <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free