Notes to Assertion

1. The article only concerns assertion with respect to its speech act properties. The topic of the content of assertions is too large to be covered here. A few other more general topics have also been left out. However, an earlier version of this entry (first published in 2007, last version Winter 2014) was organized around the relations of assertion to other topics, including truth and logic, and contained, e.g., discussions of conditional and hypothetical assertions.

2. After Lewis 1979 it is common to treat standards of precision as a factor for determining truth or falsity relative to a context, rather than as separate dimension of evaluation.

3. A referee claimed that the presupposition of (4) can be cancelled as well, as in:

  • (i) Kepler did not die in misery. Kepler doesn't exist.

My own intuition is that the addition of the second sentence induces a reinterpretation of the first. But it is possible to accommodate the opposite intuition by adopting a negative free logic, i.e., a semantics that treats atomic sentences with non-referring singular terms as false, and their negations as true. On such a semantics, the first sentence of (i) is true if the second is. The presupposition is then merely pragmatic.

4. The example is due a referee, who also claims that the embedded content is asserted in this case.

5. In some later developments of the theory of generalized conversational implicatures, especially in Levinson (2000), some generalized implicatures are not really indirectly conveyed, but contribute to what is said, for instance (directly) asserted. Thereby it competes with Relevance Theory (Sperber & Wilson 1995), the theory of implicitures (Bach 1994), and the theory of modulations (Recanati 2004), especially as regards so-called enrichments. Cf. Pagin 2014.

6. Pagin (2004: 851) suggested a so-called inferential integration test, in which a sentence proposed as being used for indirectly asserting that $p$ (e.g., by irony) replaces the corresponding explicit sentence in an inference. The idea is that if the intuitive validity of the inference is preserved, the proposed sentence can be accepted as being used for an indirect assertion.

7. Some care is needed to distinguish between what a speaker directly commits herself to and what she indirectly commits herself to by because of logical relations. If I assert that $p$ and $q$ is a logical consequence of $p$ (more properly, if this relation holds between the sentences expressing the propositions), then if I commit myself to $p$ I also, in some indirect normative sense, commit myself to $q$, but I don't really assert that $q$ if I am unaware of the consequence relation. Without a distinction between direct and indirect commitments, we would either have to require logical omniscience of asserters, or deny that the speaker in any sense commits herself to what follows from what she asserts. These issues have been studied in so-called logics of assertion. Cf. the supplement Logic and Assertion, of the earlier version of the this entry (first published in 2007, last version in the Winter 2014 archive). It should be added that what goes for logical consequence also goes for entailment more generally, e.g., in some cases of presupposition.

8. Selecting the context of utterance itself as the context of assessment relevant for assertion avoids an early critical point made by Gareth Evans (1985: 349–50): if it is left open when to assess an assertion, so that an assertion can be correct at one time and incorrect later, the speaker aiming at correctness cannot decide what to say. If the context of assessment is the context of utterance, then the speaker does know. As a result, however, a traditional connection between correctness and truth is given up. If the sentence is a future contingent, the truth value determined at a later time has no bearing on the correctness of the utterance. Cf. GarcĂ­a-Carpintero 2008; Greenough 2011; Marques 2014; Caso 2014 for further discussion of assertion in connection with relativism.

9. Lackey (2011), on the other hand, proposes that justification has two aspects, a quantitative and a qualitative. The first concerns how much justification the speaker has, the second the kind of justification it is. She suggests (2011: 273) that the knowledge norm may be appropriate for quantity, and appeals to examples of what she calls “isolated second-hand knowledge” to show that other parameters than quantity of justification are relevant.

Copyright © 2014 by
Peter Pagin <>

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