Supplement to Assertion

Social Character

This reflexive intention is formally spelled out as follows:

(JS2) S utters sentence T and means it (i.e. means literally what he says) =def S utters T and
  1. S intends (i1) the utterance U of T to produce in H the knowledge (recognition, awareness) that the states of affairs specified by (certain of) the rules of T obtain. (Call this the illocutionary effect, IE.)
  2. S intends U to produce IE by means of the recognition of i1.
  3. S intends that i1 will be recognized in virtue of (by means of) H's knowledge of (certain of) the rules governing (the elements of) T (Searle 1969, 49–50).

The illocutionary effect IE is the effect of generating the state specified in the constitutive rule. That is, in the case of assertion, the speaker intends that her utterance counts as an undertaking that p represents an actual state of affairs.

The analysis is completed by first requiring that normal input and output conditions obtain, second that the conditions of Rules 1–4 are met, and finally that the semantical rules of the dialect spoken by S and H are such that T is correctly and sincerely uttered if and only if the the aforementioned conditions are met.

Bach and Harnich follow Searle in appealing to reflexive communicative intentions. On their analysis (Bach and Harnich 1979, 42), assuming a speaker S and a hearer H,

(BH) S asserts that p iff S expresses
  1. the belief that p, and
  2. the intention that H believe that p

As we saw in the preceding section, Bach and Harnich's understanding of what it is for a speaker S to express an attitude is S to R-intend (reflexively intend) the hearer to take S's utterance as reason to think S has that attitude. They understand the reflexive nature of the intention pretty much like Searle. They say (1979, 15) that the intended effect of an act of communication is not just any effect produced by means of recognition of the intention to produce a certain effect, it is the recognition of that effect.

These appeals to reflexive intentions were later criticized, in particular by Sperber and Wilson (1992, 256–57). Their point is that if an intention I has as subintentions both the intention J and the intention that the hearer recognize I, this will yield an infintely long sequence: the intention that: J and the hearer recognize the intention that: J and the hearer recognize the intention that: J and ….). If this is an intention content at all, it is not humanly graspable.

Another variant of the communicative intention analysis is Recanati's. Part of Recanati's solution to the sneaky intention problem, following Grice (1969), consists in simply demanding that sneaky intentions be absent. This is what it is for an intention to be open, or default-reflexive (Recanati 1987, 191–207). He also follows Sperber and Wilson's idea of making something manifest, i.e. perceptible or inferable (Recanati 1987, 120, 180, Sperber and Wilson 1992, 38). Putting the various ingredients together (including prototypicality conditions of assertion—Recanati 1987, 183), we get:

(FR) To assert that p is to make an utterance u by which it is made manifest that the speaker has an open (default-reflexive) intention that
(a) u gives the audience reason to believe that the speaker knows that p and wishes to share that knowledge with the audience, and
(b) the audience recognize (a), and recognize it as open

This is another complex analysis. The complexity of these accounts is itself a problem, since it assumed that ordinary speakers are in the habit of making assertions, and thereby to have the required intentions for doing it. But since it requires detailed analytic work to come up with the accounts, and there even are competing accounts, it is unlikely that ordinary speakers have the intentions required. If they do, they are clearly not aware of having them agents usually are aware of their intentions. Postulating such intentions in ordinary speakers is clearly problematic.

The difficulty appears even worse, as argued by Glüer and Pagin (2003), because there are speakers with a demonstrated inability to understand belief and other cognitive attitudes. Some speakers with autism, with a verbal mental age of at least eleven years, who are clearly by everyday standard using language for making assertions, fail so-called false-belief tests. Thereby they reveal an inability to distinguish between a proposition being believed and being true, and hence (since they do distinguish between truth and falsity), reveal a lack of understanding of what it is to believe something. If you cannot understand what it is to believe something, you cannot intend someone to believe something either.

All in all, the complexity and sophistication required of asserters by these communication-intentions accounts, indicate that they do not provide necessary conditions for making assertions. There is a recurring feature of reasoning about communicative intentions that tends to generate such complexity. It is assumed that if an agent A intends to communicate, and communication essentially involves feature X, then A intends feature X to be instantiated. For instance, if communication takes place only if the hearer H recognizes A's intention to communicate, then, by this reasoning, A must intend H to recognize A's intention to communicate (cf. Recanati 1987, 203). But that inference is not obviously correct. For it seems a sufficient condition of being able to intend to communicate that the agent can distinguish between communicative events and other events (e.g. by perceptual features concerning signs of attention etc.), thus able to intend to realize an event of the communicative kind. It may simply be a fallacy to project the theoretical understanding of what is involved in communication on the intentions of the speakers.

Normative/institutional accounts of assertion do not seem to suffer from these problems. For instance, it is plausible that when a speaker asserts that p, she in some sense commits herself to the truth of the proposition that p. She puts her cognitive authority behind it, so to speak, and has to suffer some measure of social humiliation of what she says turns out false. This idea of commitment can also serve to distinguish between assertion proper and weaker constative forms, such as guesses and conjectures, since these differ from assertion with respect to commitment. So incurring a commitment seems to be a necessary condition of making an assertion. (However, the psychological makeup of some persistent liars poses a problem for this generalization as well. One wonders about the sense of commitment of a thirteen year-old psychopath who at an interview stated: ‘I'd just look them straight in the eye and feed them shit. It was great. I still do it. My mother bought it for a long time’ (Hare 1999, 162).)

Nonetheless, institutional accounts and intention accounts share a problem about sufficient conditions. It is argued in Pagin 2004 that social characterizations of assertion fail to be sufficient, for one can use the formulation of the account to construct an utterance type that isn't assertoric but that would be assertoric by the account in question. A simple example is given by

(1) I hereby commit myself to the truth of the proposition that there are black swans.

Intuitively, a sincere utterance of (1) would not be an assertion that there are black swans. What is said does not imply that there are black swans. It is only a declaration of the speaker's stand on the question. Still, it does incur a commitment to the truth of the proposition that there are black swans. If this is right, then incurring a commitment to truth is not sufficient for asserting. Similar constructions can be made out of other accounts, e.g. by letting the speaker declare herself to have certain complex intentions.

Social accounts of either the institutional or the intentional variety risk losing what seems to be a core feature of assertion, the judgment expressing character, however that character is to be understood.

Return to main text.

Copyright © 2007 by
Peter Pagin <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free