Supplement to Assertion

The truth predicate

That the context is effectively changed from mentioned to used can be seen by considering substitution conditions. In general, a context like

‘...’ F

where F is some arbitrary predicate, is heavily non-extensional: substituting ‘the author of The Castle’ for ‘Kafka’ in the true sentence

‘Kafka’ has five letters

produces the false sentence

‘the author of The Castle’ has five letters

despite the fact that ‘Kafka’ and ‘the author of The Castle’ are co-referring, or at least can be interchanged in all extensional contexts without change of truth value. But substituting ‘the author of The Castle’ for ‘Kafka’ in (26) produces

‘the author of The Castle wrote many letters to Milena’ is true

which has the same truth value as

(26) ‘Kafka wrote many letters to Milena’ is true

In general, the context

‘...’ is true

is extensional, and therefore what occurs in this context can be regarded, from a semantic point of view, as used.

Given that Quine characterizes (25),

(25) Kafka wrote many letters to Milena

and (26) as being equivalent in this sense, it follows that an assertion by means of (25) in a corresponding sense also is equivalent with an assertion by means of (26). So Quine need not, and probably did not, see the endorsement function as basic.

This comes out even clearer in subordinate clauses. For Quine, it is also an immediate consequence that

If ‘Kafka wrote many letters to Milena’ is true, then Milena probably wrote many letters to Kafka

is equivalent with

If Kafka wrote many letters to Milena, then Milena probably wrote many letters to Kafka

But since ‘true’ is not here used to signal endorsement, the equivalence is not an immediate consequence of Strawson's view. Rather, the reassertion account of truth needs to be supplemented with further principles to deliver the result.

Both the reassertion view and the disquotational view of truth belong to the family of deflationary theories of truth. The members of this family all explain truth by appeal to some relation between sentences like (25) and (26)/(27). (Recall that (27) is ‘That's true’.) It is, however, difficult to spell out such a relation if one is not allowed make use of the concept of truth itself, or something very close. An appeal to assertion does remain an option.

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Truth as aim: fact stating

This idea goes against Davidson's view, according to which the material biconditional

(1) ‘Bardot is good’ is true if and only if Bardot is good

is true, regardless of the status of (30). According to Davidson (1967, 31) (who was not a deflationist about truth), any peculiarity of (30),

(30) Bardot is good

e.g. that of being evaluative as opposed to fact-stating, is shared by (32),

(32) ‘Bardot is good’ is true

and so the equivalence holds anyway.

Conditionals or biconditionals like (1) do present a problem for views like Williams's. As was stressed by Peter Geach (1960, 1965) we can put evaluating or ‘ascriptive’ sentences in the antecedent of conditionals, like

(2) If Bardot is good, then I want to see all her films.

Since (30) isn't advanced categorically in either (1) or (2), no evaluation is expressed by means of it, but since these compound sentences are perfectly meaningful, (30) must be meaningful as well when occurring as a subsentence in them. In this case, which is Geach's point (which was also applied to the reassertion theory of truth in the previous subsection), the meaning of (30) cannot consist only in being usable for expressing evaluations.

One way out of this dilemma is to give up the idea that truth is substantial and adopt a deflationary view, or something close to that. In that case there need not be any conflict between the view that (30) is used to express an evaluation, and accepting (32). And if one accepts (32), one can also accept the use of (30) in the antecedent of conditionals. On this alternative, saying that assertion aims at truth reduces almost to the claim that assertions are made (directly) with declarative sentences, those that can be true. It doesn't fully reduce to this claim, since a speech act of denial (rejection) would also be made with declarative sentences, but would be opposite to assertion. We could not, however, distinguish between them by appeal to the use of ‘true’, for a denial of (30) would again be equivalent with a denial of (32).

A second way out would be to accept a full-blown realism, i.e. to accept the existence of facts of the matter corresponding to evaluative judgments of any kind. But this is a high metaphysical price to pay.

A third way would be to dissociate assertion from truth. On this alternative, a sincere utterance of (30) does express an evaluation but is an assertion nevertheless, and the meaning of (30) does not consist only in being usable for the former. We would then give up the principle of bivalence, that every sentence is either true or false, and accept more alternatives, e.g. that (30) is neither true nor false. This will or will not save Davidson's biconditional (1), depending the choice of three-valued semantics. (1) is saved if a biconditional counts as true when both left hand side and right hand side lack a truth value.

It does not seem that intuitions concerning the everyday use of ‘to assert’ are sufficiently uniform and stable for deciding the matter.

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Truth and correctness

Early on (1981, 349–51, 420–23; 1976, 48–52) Dummett was concerned with explaining how a concept of truth as distinct from a basic concept of correct assertion could emerge at all. He suggested some contexts where we find we have to make such a distinction, in particular future tense conditionals. Asserting

(3) It will rain tomorrow

is correct under the same conditions as asserting

(4) It is correctly assertible that it will rain tomorrow.

In this sense (3) and (4) are assertorically equivalent. In Dummett's terms, they have the same assertoric content (1991, 48). But asserting

If it will rain tomorrow, the match will be cancelled

is not equivalent with asserting

If it is correctly assertible that it will rain tomorrow, the match will be cancelled

because we think that the best possible evidence available today may well be inconclusive about the weather tomorrow. The antecedent of future tense conditionals is in this sense a type of truth inducing context. This context reveals that (3) and (4) do not have the same ingredient sense (Dummett 1991, 48). A further investigation of such contexts was made by Robert Brandom (1976).

Future tense sentences are special because better evidence for them than any we can have now will (normally) be available later. By contrast, a full-fledged realistic attitude dissociates truth from evidence completely. Realism about a certain area is, according to Dummett (1976, 1991), manifested by the acceptance of the principle of bivalence for sentences about that area. For instance, you are in this sense a realist about the past if you take all sentences about the past, including

At noon, 12 june 1586, there was an even number of cats in London

to be either true or false, i.e. regardless of whether there is any evidence to decide the matter. Thus, the concept of truth was seen as naturally belonging in positions where one did not equate it with correct assertibility. Dummett has argued against the legitimacy of such realist notions of truth (e.g. in Dummett 1991, 345–51).

Dummett has, however, also suggested an anti-realist conception of truth for logic and mathematics (e.g. in Dummett 1998). Logic and mathematics is different from empirical areas, since normally, what is asserted is what is proved. The possession of proof is conclusive evidence, and without a proof a mathematical assertion isn't correct. So availability of proof and correct assertibility coincides. But it cannot be correct assertibility in the subjective sense, since there may exist a proof of which the speaker isn't aware. The question is, then, what to count as objective correctness, that is, in what sense a proof shall be available. According to Dag Prawitz (1998b) it is enough that there exists a proof in an abstract, timeless sense, even if we don't know that there is a proof. Our discovery that there is one, by means of constructing a proof representation, gives us knowledge that the statement was true all along, and does not make it true. For Dummett, this is too realistic. According to Dummett, a statement counts as true just if we have a proof of it, or possess a method that is guaranteed to generate a proof or a disproof. To the latter category belongs e.g. sentence of the form

(5) n is a prime number

for some large n. We may not know whether or not n is prime, but we have a method for deciding the question, and the method will either deliver a proof that n is prime or a disproof, i.e. a proof that n is not prime. If the method would give a proof, then (5) is true even if we don't know that it is. Fermat's Theorem, on the other hand, for which no such method existed, was true on Prawitz's view before the proof by Andrew Wiles was completed, but not on Dummett's (there is, however, a complication in Dummett's case because of the semantics of past tense sentences).

A closely related question is whether the concept of truth is the most suitable central concept for a semantic theory. Dummett (1976) challenged this, and proposed instead the concept of correct assertibility, or alternatively, verifiability. Dummett's reasons were, first, that if linguistic communication is to work, speakers must be able to tell whether or not they understand each other, and, secondly, this must be possible on a sentence by sentence basis, rather than holistically, for many sentences together (as is the case in Davidson's (1973) of radical interpretation). If meaning is truth conditions, then, according to Dummett, this requirement is not met, for a speaker is not always in a position to determine whether or not a sentence is true, which would be the way of manifesting her understanding of it. By contrast, a speaker is always in a position to determine whether or not there is evidence enough for a correct assertion of the sentence.

This argument against truth conditional semantics has been much debated. A central issue is the rejection of holism, further discussed in Dummett (1991).

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Copyright © 2007 by
Peter Pagin <peter.pagin@philosophy.su.se>

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