Notes to Binarium Famosissimum

1. The phrase “doctrinal complex”was used by Gilson (for example, Gilson [1955], p. 340). Without denying medieval authors' very real disagreements in many areas, these historians nevertheless found a loose consensus among scholastics on a variety of important issues. This “common teaching” (the phrase is used by Weisheipl [1980], p. 242) was associated with the name and authority of Saint Augustine, although in fact the particular forms it took owed much to Boethius and to later Islamic and Jewish thought. One speaks therefore of an “Augustinianism” in the thirteenth century, a conservative, “traditional” teaching in contrast to the “innovations” introduced by followers of the newly translated and increasingly popular Aristotle. Gilson [1955], p. 340, says:

Representatives of this doctrinal complex are to be found everywhere in the second part of the thirteenth century, at Paris, Oxford and in Italy. … Augustinians belonged to all the religious Orders, but most of them were Franciscan Brothers, …

By contrast, others—among them Dominicans such as Albert the Great and Thomas Aquinas—tended to favor the new “Aristotelian” ideas, and were the ones largely responsible for the “innovations” the Augustinians deplored. The tensions between these two movements of thought continued until the Augustinians prevailed in the major condemnations of 1277 at Paris and Oxford, where a long list of philosophical and theological views were condemned as erroneous and dangerous, many of them introduced by Aquinas and other followers of Aristotle. Details of this way at looking at the development of thirteenth century scholasticism have been vigorously disputed by van Steenberghen and others. (For an account of the dispute up to the mid-1950s, see van Steenberghen [1955].) We need not resolve the controversy here.

2. De Wulf [1926], vol. 1, p. 335, gives a more extended list:

Taking as our basis a well-known text of John Peckham, contained in a letter to the Bishop of Lincoln (1285), opposing the Thomistic innovations in the name of traditional teaching, we may enumerate the following as the chief doctrinal characteristics of the Augustinian group: a certain pre-eminence of the good over the true, and a corresponding primacy of the will over intelligence in God and man; the production of knowledge without the causal concourse of the external object; the necessity of an immediate illuminative action on the part of God for the accomplishing of certain intellectual acts; a constant tendency to identify being and light, and accordingly to call God the Uncreated Light; a tendency to discover a luminous nature in spirits and created bodies; the ascription of a low but still a positive degree of actuality to prime matter independently of any substantial information; the presence in matter of active principles or “seminal reasons”; the existence of matter and form in spiritual substances; the multiplicity of forms in natural beings, especially in man; the identification of the soul with its faculties; and the impossibility of the creation of the world ab aeterno. To these may be added a more or less pronounced tendency to accentuate the apologetic function of philosophy.

The letter of John Pecham (or Peckham, Archbishop of Canterbury) mentioned by De Wulf may be found in Peckham [1882–85], vol. 3, p. 901. The relevant passage is quoted in Weisheipl [1980], p. 241.

3. One of the best known such arguments is Aquinas's detailed discussion in Summa theologiae I, q. 3, “On the simplicity of God.” The question is divided into eight articles, where Aquinas argues that God (1) is not a body, and furthermore involves no composition (2) of matter and form, (3) of quiddity (essence, nature) and subject, (4) of essence and being (esse), (5) of genus and difference, or (6) of subject and accident. Just in case he has overlooked any other kind of composition, he goes on in article 7 to argue that God is not in any way composite, but rather altogether simple. Finally, in article 8, he argues that not only is God not internally composite, but neither does he enter into composition with anything else.

4. The reasoning is not innocuous. It requires the substantive metaphysical claim that structural complexity of any kind cannot be taken as just a brute fact; it always requires a cause.

5. See, e.g., Bonaventure's theory as discussed in Quinn [1973], pp. 141–45, 314–16. The terminology of “corporeal” and “spiritual” matter can be found as early as Augustine, Confessions XII.17.25.

6. The most extensive survey to date is Zavalloni [1951].

7. Translated in Ockham [1991], p. 238. The argument supposes that the numerical identity of the body in such a case requires that some substantial form continue to be present both before and after death. By hypothesis, it cannot be the intellective soul, since that departs at death.

8. Aquinas [1949], p. 43 (= article 3, preliminary arguments 12 and 15). Aquinas in this article lists no fewer than twenty-one arguments in favor of plurality of forms!

9. See the selections in Hyman and Walsh [1973], pp. 349–57 (2nd ed., pp. 359–67).

10. For example, Aquinas [1949], article 1, ad 9 and article 3, responsio. For Albert the Great, see Weisheipl [1980], p. 250 (quoted below). Among modern scholars, see for example, De Wulf [1926], vol. 1, p. 229; Gilson [1955], p. 226–27; Weisheipl [1980].

11. See Weisheipl [1980], pp. 246–47.

12. Sharp [1930], pp. 63–64, 83–85.

13. Audi [1999], p. 95. See also Quinn [1973], index.

14. Edited in Baur [1912]. For a discussion of the Summa philosophiae, see De Wulf, vol. 1, pp. 357–62.

15. For Pecham and Mediavilla, see Weisheipl [1980], p. 255. For Mediavilla, see also Zavalloni [1951].

16. See Sharp [1930], Zavalloni [1951], Gilson [1955].

17. See, e.g., Aquinas [1968], Chap. 4, §2, pp. 32–33.

18. See, e.g., Aquinas [1949], article 3, pp. 48–49.

19. See the articles Godfrey of Fontaines and Duns Scotus, John, in this Encyclopedia.

20. See n. 14 above.

21. Baur [1912], p. 310: “Prima autem contrarietas in linea praedicamentali substantia a natura generis partim ratione materiae ad utrumlibet se habentis, partim a natura formae communissimae gradatim secundum proporitionem receptivitatis materiae ad particularitatem tendentis binario famosissimo contenetur, id est corporeo et incorporeo.”

22. Nevertheless, at Weisheipl [1980], p. 253, he uses the expression rather differently, citing the view that “after the monad, which is God, must come the dyad, which is matter and form (the binarium famosissimum).”

23. John Duns Scotus in fact rejected universal hylomorphism, although he accepted plurality of forms. See §2 and n. 19 above.

24. In the same note, Zavalloni says that Thomas Aquinas himself, in On Spiritual Creatures, article 1, ad 9 and ad 24, (Aquinas [1949], pp. 26–27 and p. 29) indicates the connection between the two theories. But in the first passage Aquinas only discusses how the two theories go together in Ibn Gabirol (Avicebron); he says nothing about any kind of necessarily connection. In the second passage, I fail to see any link at all.

25. Compare the second thesis I suggested in § 1 above was part of the rationale behind universal hylomorphism. See also the following argument Thomas Aquinas records in favor of universal hylomorphism (Aquinas [1949], article 1, 24th preliminary argument, p. 19): “Furthermore, every thing which is in a genus is composed of genus and difference. Now the difference is obtained from the form, whereas the genus is obtained from the matter, as he makes clear in VIII Metaphysica [2, 1043a 19; 3, 1043b 30]. Since, then, a spiritual substance is in a genus, it seems that it is composed of matter and form.” (The “he” in the second sentence refers to Aristotle.) Aquinas rejects the argument.

26. Incidentally, this reasoning would also support the view that the via affirmativa will never give us real knowledge of God; divine simplicity prevents our making true affirmations about him.

27. For more on the theories of predication sketched in this section, and on a number of related issues, see the link to Spade [1999] in the Other Internet Resources section of this article.

28. For help with much of the historical information in this article, I am indebted to private correspondence with Professor Christopher J. Martin.

Copyright © 2008 by
Paul Vincent Spade

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