Supplement to Bernard Bolzano

Bolzano's Theory of Fine Arts

In his second aesthetic treatise (Bolzano 1849e), Bolzano explains his understanding of fine arts and of works of fine art, and he presents a classification of fine arts based on an ontological analysis of the works of fine art. For Bolzano, a fine art is primarily the human faculty of producing, by a free and intentional activity, beautiful objects whose beautiful attributes are the results that are intended and also effected (i.e. actually brought about) by this activity; and a work of fine art is an object produced by such an activity (Bolzano 1849e, 137). This concept of a work of art seems too broad, however, in the context of teaching how to produce works of fine art. Bolzano therefore suggests further restrictions concerning the time taken for its production, its durability and its communicability. A work of fine art does not deserve to be treated as an object of aesthetics in general or of a theory of fine arts in particular unless a certain amount of time was needed for its production and unless a certain degree of durability of it is guaranteed as well as a certain degree of communicability which allows people to contemplate it. Bolzano obviously was steering a middle course between a one-sided author-centered and a one-sided recipient-centered view of works of fine art (cf. Reicher 2006, 306 f.).

Bolzano uses the word ‘real’ in a rather restrictive sense in accordance with the etymology of the German word ‘wirklich’, which is derived from the verb ‘wirken’, i.e. ‘to cause’ or ‘to effect’. Therefore something is real (wirklich) for Bolzano iff it is the cause of something. He assumes, in addition, that everything that is caused by something is also itself the cause of something else. (Not everything, however, that is the cause of something must also be caused by something else, since, for Bolzano, God is real and therefore the cause of other things without being caused by anything.) All works of fine art are produced and therefore caused by some activity, and therefore they are also themselves the cause of other things, and consequently they are real in Bolzano's terminology. Nevertheless, works of fine art need not automatically be material objects, i.e. objects that are of an “outer or external reality” and therefore perceivable by our “outer senses”; works of fine art can also be mental objects that are internal phenomena in the artist's mind. For Bolzano, therefore, there are works of art that exist only in the mind of human beings and are consequently called by Bolzano ‘Kunstwerke des bloßen Gedankens’ (‘works of mere thought’) whereby a thought is either a subjective idea or a subjective proposition. Very often the production of a work of art in the external or physical reality is and even must be preceded by the production of a corresponding work of thought (Bolzano 1849e, 147 f.). Works of thought as such, however, are subjective and “private”. They are therefore not communicable and consequently, in order to obtain practical relevance and a proper treatment in aesthetics, they are in need of transmission by works that can be sensually perceived. External works of art can be of a permanent or transitory nature (Bolzano 1849e, 151 f.). By this distinction Bolzano anticipated a distinction made by Nicholas Wolterstorff (1980, 36 f.), well known from current debates in aesthetics, namely the distinction between object works and occurrence works. This and many other ideas of Bolzano's aesthetics sound quite modern and — in some respects — even revolutionary. What is perhaps more surprising: in his systematic classification of fine arts that is summarized at the end of Bolzano's essay in form of a schematic survey, Bolzano anticipated or even invented certain kinds of fine arts such as “eye music” (Augenmusik) and (without using this modern term) monochrome painting which at his time did not yet exist. (Cf. again Reicher 2006, 307; also Neumaier 1999, 411, Sršeň 1986, 11 f.)

Occupying a place in his systematic survey of the fine arts, however, is by no means a sufficient condition for gaining Bolzano's admiration and not even his respect for the kind of fine art in question. Bolzano assigns, for instance, a certain position in his division of the fine arts to theatrical performances (Bolzano 1849e, 174, 178), but in an ideal state theatre plays are not performed, not even by amateurs. As the mere art of imitating or even pretending something that is not really the case, such theatrical performances must even be forbidden in an appropriately organized state, since they are not only an offence against good taste but even immoral (Bolzano 1932, 95). In a well-organized state nobody is allowed to be an actor or actress by profession. Also dancing, writing poetry and even composing or playing music are not allowed to be a lifetime profession, but at best a temporary one in a suitably organized state (Bolzano 1932, 78, 94). These quite illiberal regulations are the result of Bolzano's ethical views and — as he himself saw it — even entailed by them. Similarly, all aesthetic evaluations are subject to moral standards. Nothing can be perfectly beautiful, according to Bolzano, unless it is also morally good (RW IV, 295), and a work of literature in particular must have moral value in order to be also of real poetic value (Bolzano 1932, 94). Here, the deficiencies of Bolzano's aesthetics finally come to light. (For a survey of Bolzano's aesthetics cf. Blaukopf 1996.)

Copyright © 2013 by
Edgar Morscher <>

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