#### Supplement to Bernard Bolzano

## A Formal Reconstruction of Bolzano's Definitions of Logical Truth and Logical Consequence

### Bolzano's Method of Idea-Variation

The formal basis of Bolzano's operation of idea-variation is a
function which assigns — under certain conditions — to
each proposition *s*, each sequence *i* of ideas
*i*_{1}, *i*_{2},…,
*i _{n}*, and each sequence

*j*of ideas

*j*

_{1},

*j*

_{2},…,

*j*a proposition

_{n}*s*′;

*s*′ thereby results from

*s*by replacing simultaneously and uniformly in

*s*, for each

*k*(1 ≤

*k*≤

*n*), the idea

*i*with the corresponding idea

_{k}*j*. We will call

_{k}*s*′ the ‘

*j*/

*i*-variant of

*s*’ and use for it the notation ‘

*s*(

*j*/

*i*)’. The following conditions must be fulfilled in order that

*s*(

*j*/

*i*) is defined:

- Each of the
*i*s (1 ≤_{k}*k*≤*n*) must be simple (whereas the*j*s need not be simple). Since only for a few examples of ideas we know that Bolzano takes them to be simple, we must, at least for practical purposes, opt for the weaker requirement that the_{k}*i*s are “relatively” simple in the sense that in each particular context under consideration they are not further analyzed into parts but “taken” to be simple._{k} - None of the
*i*s is a purely logical idea such as [to have] (or [to be]), [non] or [something] (whereas the_{k}*j*s can be purely logical)._{k} - The
*i*s are pair-wise distinct (whereas the_{k}*j*s need not be)._{k} - Moreover, in order to keep the result of the replacement
operation “well-formed”, i.e., a genuine proposition, we
must require that each
*j*“fits” the corresponding_{k}*i*, i.e., is of the same semantic category. (What it means that two ideas belong to the same semantic category is not precisely defined by Bolzano.)_{k} - Finally, we must also require that at least one of the ideas
*i*must be contained in_{k}*s*as one of its parts so that the operation of replacement is never performed vacuously. (This requirement serves the purpose to avoid the usual stipulation that every*j*/*i*-variant of a proposition*s*is identical with*s*itself if none of the*i*s is contained in_{k}*s*; this stipulation has consequences that are incompatible with Bolzano's views.)

We will now define several auxiliary concepts:

A proposition

s′ is ani-variantof a propositions=_{df}

∃j(s′ =s(j/i)).

The *form of a proposition* *s* with respect to a
sequence *i* of ideas (‘*FP*(*s*,
*i*)’) is the set of all *i*-variants of
*s*, i.e.,

FP(s,i) =_{df}{s′ | ∃j(s′ =s(j/i))}.

By derelativization we get the more general concepts of a
propositional *i*-form and of a propositional form:

Fis apropositional i-form(‘P(F,i)’) =_{df}∃s(F=FP(s,i)).

Fis apropositional form(‘P(F)’) =_{df}∃i(P(F, i)).

Intuitively, the form of a particular proposition *s* with
respect to a sequence *i* of ideas seems to be a kind of
property rather than a set of entities and should therefore be
indicated more adequately by an open formula. An open formula,
however, has no *designatum*. This was presumably the motive
for Bolzano's quite modern view to identify the form of *s*
with respect to *i* with a precisely specified object, namely
the set of propositions that is characterized by our aforementioned
definition.

Instead of saying that a *j*/*i*-variant of a
proposition *s* is true (or that it is a true variant of
*s*), Bolzano prefers to say: *j macht s hinsichtlich i
wahr*, i.e.: *j* verifies *s* with respect to
*i* (or, more literally: *j* makes *s* true with
respect to *i*). In today's terminology this amounts to saying
that *s*(*j*/*i*) is a model of *s* with
respect to *i*. Let us abbreviate ‘proposition *s*
is true’ by ‘*Ts*’, and ‘*j*
verifies *s* with respect to *i*’ by
‘*MT*(*j*, *s*, *i*)’; we can
then define:

MT(j,s,i) =_{df}Ts(j/i).

We will now define first what it means for a propositional
*form* to be universally valid (or contravalid), and then
explain — by means of this concept — corresponding
properties of single propositions. In addition to the symbols already
introduced, we will use in what follows also ‘*Es*’
for ‘the subject idea of *s* is empty’. We will say
— with Bolzano — of a propositional form that it is
universally valid just in case all of its members with non-empty
subject ideas are true. Hereby we have to keep in mind that, as in his
analysis of the expressions ‘all’ and ‘every’
of the object language, Bolzano uses these expressions also in his
metalanguage with existential import. The definition has thus to be
stated formally in the following way:

A propositional formFisuniversally valid(‘UV(F)’) =_{df}

∃s(s∈F∧Ts) ∧ ∀s((s∈F∧ ¬Es) →Ts).

We could replace the first conjunct of the definiens by
∃*s*(*s* ∈ *F* ∧
¬*Es*). In order to formulate our definitions uniformly and
keep them close to Bolzano's own words, we choose the alternative
version above.

A propositional form

Fisuniversally contravalid

(‘UC(F)’) =_{df}∀s(s∈F→ ¬Ts).A proposition

sisuniversally valid with respect to i

(‘UV(s,i)’) =_{df}∃F(P(F,i) ∧UV(F) ∧s∈F).A proposition

sisuniversally contravalid with respect to i

(‘UC(s,i)’) =_{df}∃F(P(F,i) ∧UC(F) ∧s∈F).A proposition

sisanalytic with respect to i

(‘Analytic(s,i)’) =_{df}UV(s,i) ∨UC(s,i).A proposition

sissynthetic with respect to i

(‘Synthetic(s,i)’) =_{df}¬Analytic(s,i).A proposition

sisanalytic=_{df}∃i(Analytic(s, i)).A proposition

sissynthetic=_{df}∃i(Synthetic(s,i)).

### Bolzano's Definition of Logical Truth

From a logical point of view, the most interesting results will turn
up if *all extra-logical parts* of a proposition, which are
simple (or — as explained before —
“relatively” simple), are taken to be variable (WL II,
84). This restriction results in the concept of the *logical*
form of a proposition: The *logical form* of a proposition
*s* (‘*LFP*(*s*)’) is the set of all
propositions which result from it when all of its extra-logical simple
parts are replaced by arbitrary but “fitting” ideas. To
simplify matters, we will assume for what follows that for any
proposition *s* there is always fixed a certain alphabetic
order of all extra-logical simple ideas contained in it; thereby, for
every proposition *s*, a sequence
*i^{s}* of all extra-logical simple ideas
contained in

*s*is uniquely determined. We can then define:

LFP(s) =_{df}FP(s,i), i.e. {^{s}s′ | ∃j(s′ =s(j/i))}.^{s}

A logical propositional form is a set of propositions which is the logical form of a proposition:

Fis alogical propositional form(‘LP(F)’) =_{df}∃ s(F=LFP(s)).

Another way to characterize a logical propositional form is to say that it is a propositional form such that every idea contained in all of its members is purely logical in nature. This results in the following alternative definition of a logical propositional form:

Fis alogical propositional form(‘LP(F)’) =_{df}P(F) ∧

∀i(∀s(s∈F→ i∈ Content(s)) →iis purely logical).

If a propositional form is a logical propositional form and all of its
members are true, provided their subject idea is non-empty, Bolzano
will say that it is *logico-universally* valid or (put briefly)
*logically valid*.

A propositional form Fislogically valid(‘LV(F)’) =_{df}LP(F) ∧UV(F).A propositional form Fislogically contravalid(‘LC(F)’) =_{df}LP(F) ∧UC(F).

By means of these definitions of properties of a propositional form we can now define the corresponding properties of a single proposition:

A proposition sislogically true(‘LT(s)’) =_{df}∃ F(LV(F) ∧s∈F).A proposition sislogically false(‘LF(s)’) =_{df}∃ F(LC(F) ∧s∈F).A proposition sislogically analytic(‘LA(s)’) =_{df}LT(s) ∨LF(s).A proposition s is logically synthetic(‘LS(s)’) =_{df}¬ LA(s).

We have already come to know an example of each of these kinds of propositions such as the logically true proposition [Kant is German or non-German], the logically false proposition [Kant is German and non-German], and the logically synthetic proposition [Kant is a German philosopher].

This reconstruction gives priority to the logical validity of a
propositional form and defines by means of it the logical truth and
related properties of a proposition. If — as in the majority of
reconstructions — a logically true proposition is directly
defined as a proposition *s* all of whose logical variants
(i.e., all of its variants with respect to
*i^{s}*) are true (provided their
subject idea is non-empty), we get a problem with purely logical
propositions. A proposition is purely logical if all of its parts are
purely logical. Examples of purely logical propositions are the
following ones: [There is something], [There is something or there is
nothing], [There is something and there is nothing], i.e. in the
language of first order quantification theory with identity,
[∃

*x*(

*x*=

*x*)], [∃

*x*(

*x*=

*x*) ∨ ¬∃

*x*(

*x*=

*x*)], and [∃

*x*(

*x*=

*x*) ∧ ¬∃

*x*(

*x*=

*x*)].

Since each part of such a proposition is of a purely logical nature,
no part of such a proposition could be replaced by means of the
variation method due to qualification ii; and due to qualification v
the operation of idea-variation is not even defined for such cases. If
we would give up qualification v, each of these propositions would be
its own only variant. If it is true (such as
[∃*x*(*x* = *x*) ∨
¬∃*x*(*x* = *x*)]), it will therefore
be logically true, if false (such as [∃*x*(*x* =
*x*) ∧ ¬∃*x*(*x* = *x*)]),
it will be logically false. What, however, about
[∃*x*(*x* = *x*)]? Since it is obviously
true, it had to be logically true — contrary not only to our
intuition but also to Bolzano's view, according to which it is a truth
of logic but not a logical truth (WL II, 375). This is also the result
of the reconstruction presented here: [There is something] is a true
purely logical proposition, but not a logically true proposition;
rather, it is a synthetic proposition. (The same result can be reached
within the traditional reconstruction by regarding [something] as not
purely logical in nature; this, however, would be in clear
contradiction to Bolzano.)

### Bolzano's Definition of Material Consequence and of Logical Consequence

We have explained Bolzano's method of idea-variation above (as well as
in Section 4.6 of the main text) with respect to single
propositions. In order to apply it also to arguments, we have to
extend our original definitions to whole *sets* of
propositions. In applying the operation of variation to a set
σ of propositions, each member of σ is
replaced by its corresponding variant; this turns σ
into another set σ(*j*/*i*), i.e., the
*j*/*i*-variant of σ, that can be defined
as follows:

σ(j/i) =_{df}{s′ | ∃s(s∈ σ ∧s′ =s(j/i))}.

We will say of a set of propositions that it is true iff all of its members are true:

σ is true (‘σ’) =T_{df}∀s(s∈ σ →Ts).

Thus we can say — by analogy to single propositions — also
for a whole set σ of propositions that it is verified
(or “made true”) by a sequence *j* of ideas with
respect to another sequence *i* of ideas:

(MTj, σ,i) =_{df}

σ(Tj/i), i.e., ∃s(s∈ σ ∧Ts(j/i)) ∧∀s(s∈ σ →Ts(j/i)).

Analogously to the form and the logical form of a single proposition, the form and the logical form of a set of propositions can be defined as follows:

The

i-form of a set σ of propositions(i.e., the form of σ with respect to a sequenceiof ideas of which at least one is contained in at least one member of σ, briefly: ‘FS(σ,i)’) is the set of alli-variants of σ, i.e.,

FS(σ,i) =_{df}{σ′ | ∃j(σ′ = σ(j/i))}.

Fisan i-form of a set of propositions(‘S(F,i)’) iff for some set σ of propositions,Fis thei-form of σ, i.e.,

S(F,i) =_{df}∃σ(F=FS(σ,i)).

Fisa form of a set of propositions(‘S(F)’) iff for somei,Fis a form of a set of propositions with respect toi, i.e.,

S(F) =_{df}∃i(S(F,i)).The

logical form of a set σof propositions (‘LFS(σ)’) is thei-form of σ (where^{σ}iis the — alphabetically ordered — sequence of all extra-logical simple ideas contained in the members of σ), i.e.,^{σ}

LFS(σ) =_{df}S(σ,i).^{σ}

The form and the logical form of an argument can then be defined as follows:

The j/i-variant of an argument<σ,s> (‘<σ,s>(j/i)’) is the argument <σ′,s′>, where σ′ is thej/i-variant of σ ands′ is thej/i-variant ofs, i.e.,

<σ,s>(j/i) =_{df}<σ(j/i),s(j/i)>.<σ′,

s′> isan i-variant of an argument<σ,s> iff <σ′,s′> is aj/i-variant of <σ,s> for some sequencej, i.e.,

<σ′,s′> isan i-variant of an argument<σ,s> =_{df}

∃j(σ′ = σ(j/i) ∧s′ =s(j/i)).

The i-form of an argument<σ,s> (‘FA(<σ,s>,i)’) is the set of all of itsi-variants, i.e.,

FA(<σ,s>,i) =_{df}{<σ′,s′> | ∃j(σ′ = σ(j/i) ∧s′ =s(j/i))}.

Fisan i-form of an argument(‘A(F,i)’) iff there is a set σ of propositions and a propositionssuch thatFis thei-form of the argument <σ,s>, i.e.,

A(F,i) =_{df}∃σ∃s(F=FA(<σ,s>,i)).

Correspondingly, an *argument form* is an *i*-form of
an argument for at least one sequence *i* of ideas:

Fisan argument form(‘A(F)’) =_{df}∃i(A(F,i)).

An argument form *F* is *deductively correct*
(‘*D*(*F*)’) iff each of its members is such
that if all of its premises are true then its conclusion is likewise
true, i.e., formally (keeping in mind the existential import of
‘each’, ‘every’ and ‘all’):

D(F) =_{df}

∃σ∃s(<σ,s> ∈F∧σ) ∧ ∀σ∀Ts((<σ,s> ∈F∧σ) →TTs).

The first conjunct of the definiens of this definition guarantees that, in order for an argument to be a member of a deductively correct argument form (and to be deductively correct itself), the set of its premises must be satisfiable or (semantically) consistent. The set of premises of such an argument must therefore be compatible with its conclusion. Consequently, Bolzano treats (logical) consequence as a special case of (logical) compatibility (WL II, 113, 475). This, again, is typical for Bolzano's approach in which the words ‘each’, ‘every’ and ‘all’ have existential import also in the meta-language.

An argument form *F* is *deductively correct* *with
respect to a sequence i of ideas* (‘*D*(*F*,
*i*)’) iff *F* is an *i*-form of an
argument, and *F* is deductively correct:

D(F,i) =_{df}A(F,i) ∧D(F).

A proposition *s* *follows from* (or is a
*consequence of*) a set σ of propositions
*with respect to a sequence i of ideas*
(‘*Consequ*(*s*, σ, *i*)’) iff <σ, *s*> is a member of an argument form which is deductively correct with respect to *i*:

Consequ(s, σ,i) =_{df}∃F(D(F,i) ∧ <σ,s> ∈F).

If an argument <σ, *s*> is a member of
an *argument form* which is deductively correct with respect
to *i*, we will say of the *particular argument itself*
that it is likewise deductively correct with respect
to *i*.

We can now define the fundamental concept of logical consequence. Our definition of this concept makes use of the auxiliary notion of a logical argument form which we have to introduce first.

The *logical form of an argument* <σ,
*s*> is
its *i*^{σ∪{s}}-form, i.e., the set
of all of its
*i*^{σ∪{s}}-variants, and a
*logical argument form* is the logical form of at least one
argument:

LFA(<σ,s>) =_{df}FA(<σ,s>,i^{σ∪{s}}), i.e.,

{<σ′,s′> | ∃j(σ′ = σ(j/i) ∧^{σ}s′ =s(j/i))}.^{s}

Fis alogical argument form(‘LAF(F)’) =_{df}

∃σ∃s(F=LFA(<σ,s>)).

An argument form *F* is *logico-deductively correct* or
(briefly put) *logically correct*
(‘*LD*(*F*)’) iff *F* is a logical
argument form and *F* is deductively correct, i.e.,

LD(F) =_{df}LAF(F) ∧D(F).

A proposition *s* *follows logically* from a set
σ of propositions, i.e., *s* is a *logical
consequence* of σ
(‘*L*-*Consequ*(*s*,
σ)’) iff there is a logically correct argument
form *F* and <σ, *s*> is a member
of *F*:

L-Consequ(s, σ) =_{df}∃F(LD(F) ∧ <σ,s> ∈F).

For example, the proposition [Kant is German] is a logical consequence of the set {[Kant is Austrian or German], [Kant is non-Austrian]}.

If an argument <σ, *s*> is a member of an *argument form* which is logically correct, we will say of the *particular argument itself* that it is likewise logically correct.

Similarly as before with single propositions and their logical truth, we
gave also here priority to the argument *form* and its
deductive and logical correctness and defined in terms of it
consequence in general (or “material” consequence) and
logical consequence. We could thereby avoid the result that each of
two true purely logical propositions, i.e., true propositions that do
not contain any extra-logical idea, is a logical consequence of the
other one, thus, e.g., not only [There is at least one thing] being a
logical consequence of {[There are at least two things]} but also
*vice versa* [There are at least two things] being a logical
consequence of {[There is at least one thing]} — quite contrary
to our intuition and also to Bolzano's view.

A basic prerequisite for Bolzano's definition of logical consequence as well as for his definition of logical truth is the distinction between simple ideas that are purely logical and those that are not so. Bolzano explicates the distinction only by means of examples, his favorite examples for simple and purely logical ideas being [has], [non], and [something] (WL II, 84). Beyond that he frankly confesses that the distinction is not “scharf begrenzt” (sharply delineated) but rather “schwankend” (unsteady). In the German original of his paper on logical consequence (Tarski 1936), Alfred Tarski used almost the same German words to circumscribe exactly the same problem Bolzano had pointed out quite clearly almost exactly 100 years before.

Our reconstruction of Bolzano's definitions is not particularly affected, however, by this problem, since in the examples used in support of the reconstruction presented here, only ideas were used (such as negation, conjunction, disjunction, and emptiness of an idea) whose logical status seems more or less uncontroversial (as is the case regarding the corresponding connectives, the quantifiers and the identity symbol in a formal language).

Logical consequence is not the only important logical relation Bolzano has defined by means of his method of idea variation. In a similar way, he defines many other logical concepts, such as the properties of satisfiability and unsatisfiability of a set of propositions and the relations of compatibility and incompatibility between propositions or sets of propositions, and, above all, various concepts of probability.

### Concluding Remarks

Bolzano's introduction of ideas and propositions into logic was, in
spite of their problematic ontological character, historically
inestimable in its value, for it allowed for the clear separation of
logic from psychology. Although this presupposition was extremely
important for himself for obtaining new insights in the realm of logic
and for defining basic concepts in an objective manner, most of these
new insights and definitions do in fact not depend on the ontological
presupposition of a World 3 (as important as it was for Bolzano
himself in the context of his discoveries). The theory of
idea-variation is perhaps Bolzano's most important and fruitful
achievement, which could not be appreciated until the 20th
century. (It was for the first time in Łukasiewicz 1913 that
— despite some critical remarks — the value of Bolzano's
innovation was recognized.) Bolzano develops his method of
idea-variation with respect to ideas and propositions, but one can apply his notions and definitions also to linguistic
expressions. Their scope and value is therefore not bound to the
problematic presupposition of his World 3. (For this purpose, of
course, we need linguistic expressions not only in the form of tokens
but also in the form of types.) In transferring Bolzano's concepts and
doctrines from World 3 to the level of language, however, we have to
face a serious problem that is widely discussed in modern logic:
Whereas Bolzano could light-heartedly assume that for every object
*x* there is an idea of which *x* is the only object,
this is definitely not true on the level of language: not everything
has a name in a language. (Thus, the objection brought forward in
Tarski 1956, 415f., against Carnap's definition of logical
consequence in his *Logical Syntax of Language*, does not apply
to Bolzano's approach.) There is therefore not a simple
1-1-transformation of Bolzano's views to the sphere of language; his
basic insights, however, can be transferred in a modified form.

Only from the perspective of modern logic was it possible fully to appreciate the significance of Bolzano's work in logic. No wonder, therefore, that prominent representatives of modern logic were attracted by Bolzano's logical achievements (as is witnessed by publications listed in the bibliography whose authors are, e.g., Bar-Hillel, Beth, Church, Löwenheim, Łukasiewicz, Quine, Russell, Scholz, Tarski, and Wang).

Only with the help of the precise tools of modern logic was it
possible moreover to reconstruct Bolzano's logic in an appropriate
way. This was done in an exemplary way by Jan Berg (in Berg 1962, and
later in his introductions to the edition of the *Theory of
Science* in BGA I, 11–14); most of the recent publications
on Bolzano's logic, including the preceding survey, are based —
explicitly or implicitly — on Berg's work.

The present survey of Bolzano's logic was restricted to formal questions. Questions of philosophical logic were excluded from this survey, although Bolzano made many interesting contributions in this field, in particular in deontic logic (see section 6.4), epistemic logic, and above all in alethic modal logic. (A survey of Bolzano's contributions to philosophical logic can be found in Morscher 1974 and 2007.)