Notes to Callicles and Thrasymachus

1. For the term ‘immoralism’ see e.g., Dodds 1959, 266 (citing Shorey); Bernard Williams discusses the ‘amoralist’ (1972, 3–13, 1985, 22–32). Either label is misleading, in that no term corresponding neatly to our ‘morality’ occurs in Plato's works, or indeed in the Greek language. What Thrasymachus and Callicles challenge is the value of justice, dikaiosunê. However, ancient talk of justice often maps on to modern talk about ‘morality’ reasonably well, since it is in relation to justice that, in the ancient world, questions about conflicts between self-interest and the demands of virtue tend to be framed. However, it is important to bear in mind that justice is only one of a number of virtues prized by the ancients, and so only one part of what, in the ancient tradition, constitutes the sphere of the moral or ethical. In section (5), we note that ‘immoralist’ may well not be the right word for Callicles in particular, since he is arguably the advocate of an anti-conventional morality of his own.

2. For Thrasymachus, see White 1995; on Callicles, cf. the speculations of Dodds 1959, 12–15.

3.This is an oversimplified picture. For one thing, aretê in Homer's world sometimes seems to be simply a matter of noble birth, as it is in some later aristocratic authors like Theognis (see Finkelberg 1998). Also, though their relation to aretê is somewhat unclear, Homer and his characters also place enormous value on a complex of ‘softer’ traits such as reverence, piety, self-restraint, compassion and acceptance of one's limitations.

4. A more fully argued version of the reading offered here can be found in Barney 2006.

5. Other important examples include the Sisyphus fragment and Antiphon's discussion of justice in On Truth: see Kerferd 1981a, Chapter 10.

Copyright © 2011 by
Rachel Barney <rachel.barney@utoronto.ca>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free