#### Supplement to Probabilistic Causation

## Suppes' Motivation for the No-screening-off Condition

Recall the Reichenbach-Suppes theory of causation:

C_{t}is a cause ofE_{t′}if and only if:

- P(
E_{t′}|C_{t}) > P(E_{t′}| ~C_{t}); and- There is no further event
B_{t″}, occurring at a timet″ earlier than or simultaneously witht, that screensE_{t′}off fromC_{t}.

Reichenbach added condition (ii) to rule out spurious correlations.
Suppes motivates condition (ii) in a different way. Suppose that a
system has two possible states at
time *t*_{1}, *B* and ~*B*; it has three
possible states at time *t*_{2},
*C*, *C*′ and *C*″; and two possible
states at *t*_{3}, *E* and ~*E*, with *t*_{1}
< *t*_{2} < *t*_{3}. Suppose the probabilities are as
follows:
P(*B*) = P(~*B*) = .5.
P(*C* | *B*) =
P(*C*′ | *B*) = .5,
P(*C*″ | *B*) = 0;
P(*C* | ~*B*) =
P(*C*′ | ~*B*) = .25, P(*C*″ | ~*B*) = .5;
P(*E* |*C*) =
P(*E* | *C*′) = .5,
P(*E* | *C*″) = 0. Suppose moreover
that *C*, *C*′, and *C*″ screen
*B* and ~*B* off from *E* and ~*E*. Suppose
that *B*, *C*, and *E* occur at times
*t*_{1}, *t*_{2},
and *t*_{3} respectively. Now ~*C* is logically
equivalent to
*C*′ ∨ *C*″.
Then P(*E* | *C*) = .5 >
P(*E* | ~*C*) =
P(*E* | *C*′ ∨ *C*″) = .3, in accord with condition (i). However,
P(*E* | *C* & *B*) = .5 = P(*E* | ~*C* & *B*), in violation of condition (ii).
Intuitively, the idea is this. Overall, *C* raises the
probability of *E*, because in one of the alternatives to
*C*, namely *C*″, the probability of *E* is
much lower. However, once *B* occurs, the only possible
alternative to *C* is *C*′. Thus, given that
*B* has already occurred, the occurrence of *C* (as
opposed to *C*′) does not make a difference to the
probability of *E*. Thus, Suppes argues that *C* is not a
cause of *E*, since the probability of *E* was already
fixed by *B*. But this example does not have a common cause
structure; the structure is like the causal chain depicted in Figure 2
in the main text.