#### Supplement to Probabilistic Causation

## The Fork Asymmetry and the Second Law of Thermodynamics

Reichenbach (1956) saw his fork asymmetry as a macro-statistical
analog of the second law of thermodynamics. The idea is roughly along
the following lines. Suppose we have a system such as a beach that is
essentially isolated from the rest of its environment. Suppose
moreover that we find this system in a state of low entropy;
e.g. there are footprints on the beach. The second law of
thermodynamics tells us that the system did not spontaneously evolve
into this state; rather, the low entropy state must be the result of
an earlier interaction with some other system (a human walking on the
beach). This interaction ‘prepares’ the system in a low
entropy state, but once the system is isolated, its entropy will
increase. Now suppose that we have two events *A*
and *B*. If we hold fixed the probability of each event
individually, a probability distribution over the
partition *A*&*B*, *A*&~*B*,
~*A*&*B*, ~*A*&~*B* will have
more information, in the sense of Shannon (1948), when *A*
and *B* are correlated. The formal definition of entropy is
closely related to that of information, the two being inversely
proportional. So when *A* and *B* are correlated, we
have the analog of a system in a state of low entropy. This state is
then to be explained in terms of some earlier event that prepares the
system.