Supplement to Probabilistic Causation

Contextual-unanimity and Dupré's Critique

Dupré (1984) raises the following counterexample to the contextual unanimity requirement. Suppose that there is a very rare gene that has the following effect: those that possess the gene have their chances of contracting lung cancer lowered when they smoke. In this scenario, there would be a background context in which smoking lowers the probability of lung cancer: thus smoking would not be a cause of lung cancer according to the context-unanimity requirement. Nonetheless, it seems unlikely that the discovery of such a gene would lead us to abandon the claim that smoking causes lung cancer.

Dupré suggests instead that we should deem C to be a cause of E if it raises the probability of E in a ‘fair sample’—a sample that is representative of the population as a whole. Mathematically, this amounts to the requirement that

(Dupré) C causes E if and only if ΣB P(E | C & B) × P(B) > ΣB P(E | ~C & B) × P(B)

where B ranges over the relevant background contexts. This is the same as requiring that C must raise the probability of E in a weighted average of background contexts, where each background context is weighted by the product of P(B) and the absolute value of P(E | C & B) − P(E | ~C & B). (Interestingly, Eells (1991, p. 88) offers the difference between the two expressions in (Dupré) as a measure of ‘Average Degree of Causal Significance’.)

Dupré's account surely comes closer to capturing our ordinary use of causal language. On the other hand, Eells' population-relative formulation allows us to make more precise causal claims: in the population as a whole, smoking is a mixed cause of lung cancer; in the sub-population of individuals who lack the gene, smoking is a positive cause of lung cancer; in the sub-population consisting of individuals who possess the gene, smoking is a negative cause of lung cancer.

In any event, this debate does not really seem to be about the metaphysics of causation. As we saw in Section 2.6, causal relevance is really the basic metaphysical concept. The dispute between Dupré and Eells is really a debate about how best to use the word ‘cause’ to pick out a particular species of causal relevance. Dupré's proposed usage will count as (positive) causes many things that will be mixed causes in Eells' proposed usage. But there does not seem to be any underlying disagreement about which factors are causally relevant. (For defence of a similar position, see Twardy and Korb (2004).)

In addition to the critique of Eells' and Cartwright's theories discussed above, Dupré (1984) also complained that these theories were inconsistent in the way they treated background factors and causal intermediaries. If we want to evaluate the causal relevance of C for E, these theories require that we hold fixed independent causes of E, but not that we hold fixed factors that are causal intermediaries between C and E. Dupré argued that instead we should average over both types of factors. Another alternative would be to hold both types of factors fixed. Holding fixed causal intermediaries leads to an account of path-specific causation, discussed in Section 2.9.

Copyright © 2010 by
Christopher Hitchcock <cricky@caltech.edu>

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