Supplement to Probabilistic Causation

Three Results Concerning Statistical Distinguishability

1. Time-ordered variables

If the variables in V are ordered from ‘earlier’ to ‘later’, such that only earlier variables can cause later ones; if the probability P assigns positive probability to every assignment of values of the variables in V; and the probability measure P satisfies the Causal Markov and Minimality Conditions with respect to the graph G; then it will be possible to uniquely identify the graph G on the basis of P. (Pearl 1988, Chapter 3.) This is a very strong result. If the variables in V are time-indexed, and we disallow any graph with an arrow from a later variable to an earlier variable, then causation does reduce to probability if the CMC and Minimality Conditions hold.

2. Linear Functions with Non-Gaussian Errors

If the variables in V are continuous; each variable is a linear function of its parents, together with an error distribution that is non-Gaussian; and the probability P on V satisfies the CMC and Minimality Condition with respect to the graph G; then it will be possible to uniquely identify G on the basis of P. (Shimizu, Hoyer, Hyvärinen, and Kerminen (2006).) If the way in which each variable in V depends upon its parents has the right functional form, then it is possible to recover the causal structure from the probability even without temporal information.

3. Statistical Distinguishability via Embedding Graphs

Let G and G′ be any two graphs over the vertex set V such that every probability distribution on V that satisfies the CMC and Minimality Condition with respect to G also satisfies these conditions with respect to G′, and vice versa. Then there exists a variable set WV, and graphs G*, G on W such that: (a) if X and Y are both in V, then G* will have an arrow from X to Y just in case G does and G will have an arrow from X to Y just in case G′ does; and (b) if at least one of X or Y is not in V but both are in W, then G* will have an arrow from X to Y just in case G does (so intuitively, G* and G are embeddings of G and G′ (respectively) into the same external structure); and (c) some probability measure on W that satisfies the CMC and Minimality Condition with respect to G* does not satisfy these conditions with respect to G , or vice versa. (Spirtes, Glymour and Scheines (2000), Chapter 4.) Thus if we are not able to determine from probabilities alone whether G or G′ is the correct causal graph over V, we may be able to settle the matter by looking for the right sort of additional variables.

Copyright © 2010 by
Christopher Hitchcock <cricky@caltech.edu>

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