Supplement to Probabilistic Causation

Singular Causation and the Evolution of Probabilities in Time

1. Eells' Theory of Singular Causation

We have discussed Eells' theory of general causation in Sections 2.6 and 2.7 above. However, Eells thought that singular causation was independent of general causation, and offered a separate theory of singular causation in chapter 6 of his (1991). For Eells, the relata of singular causation are the instantiations of properties by events. To evaluate the causal relevance of event c's being of type C for e's being E, we look at probabilities of the form P(E | C & B), where B is a background context of the sort discussed in Sections 2.5 and 2.6 above. However, instead of looking at all background contexts exhibited in a certain population, we need consider only the background context that was realized in the actual situation. Moreover, instead of comparing the probability P(E | C & B) with P(E | ~C & B), we instead look at how the probability of E evolves around the time of C′s occurrence. We do this by conditioning on a sequence of properties. For example, let {…, C−2C−1} be a sequence of properties realized by the events in the causal chain leading up to C, and {C1C2, …} be a sequence of properties realized by the events in the causal chain from C to E. Then we can trace the evolution of E's probability through time by looking at the successive conditional probabilities P(E | C−2 & B), P(E | C−1 & B), P(E | C & B), P(E | C1 & B), P(E | C2 & B). Let c and e be two events that actually occur, with e occurring after c, and that exemplify properties C and E, respectively.

(Eellss)

  1. e exemplifies E because of c's being C, just in case the probability of e's exemplifying E shortly after the time of c's occurrence is higher than the probability of e's exemplifying E shortly before the time of c's occurrence, and remains higher up until the occurrence of e.
  2. e exemplifies E despite c's being C, just in case the probability of e's exemplifying E shortly after the time of c's occurrence is lower than the probability of e's exemplifying E shortly before the time of c's occurrence, and only gradually rises thereafter.
  3. e exemplifies E independently of c's being C, just in case the probability of e's exemplifying E shortly after the time of c's occurrence is equal to the probability of e's exemplifying E shortly before the time of c's occurrence, and only gradually rises thereafter.
  4. e exemplifies E autonomously of c's being C, just in case the probability of e's exemplifying E shortly after the time of c's occurrence is higher than the probability of e's exemplifying E shortly before the time of c's occurrence, but the probability of e's being E drops to a value equal to or lesser than its earlier probability at some point between the occurrence of c and e.

The definition of autonomy is not very intuitive, but readers can confirm that it is the one case that is not covered by one of the other three types.

Consider the case of the badly hit golf ball discussed in Section 2.10 above. According to Eells, the probabilities evolve as follows. Up until the moment the club strikes the ball, there is some chance that the club will hit the ball squarely, and hence a reasonably high probability that the ball will land in the hole. At the very moment the club hits the ball at an odd angle, it is improbable that the ball will land in the hole. However, the ball comes off the club on a trajectory heading toward the fortunately placed tree, and so the probability of the ball landing in the hole is higher than it was before the club hit the ball. Thus Eells' account rules that the ball landed in the hole because the ball was sliced. One concern we might have about this analysis is whether these probabilities are the most natural ones to assign in Rosen's story, and whether changing the probabilities would really lead to a change in our causal judgment of the sort that Eells' account mandates.

2. Kvart's Theory

Igal Kvart has developed a probabilistic account of singular causation in a series of publications. The main ideas are covered in Kvart (2004), along with a discussion of a number of cases. We will here present a slightly simplified version of Kvart's theory.

Let C and E be two events, and let BC be the state of the world immediately prior to C′s occurrence. A probabilistic theory such as Lewis's focuses on what Kvart calls the ab initio probabilities P(E | C & BC) and P(E | ~C & BC). (Note that this is not true in the theories of Cartwright and Eells, discussed above in Sections 2.5 to 2.7, and in the previous section of this supplement. Those theories require that background contexts B hold fixed independent causes of E, regardless of whether those causes occur before or after the time of C′s occurrence.) These are the probabilities of E at the time of C′s occurrence. These probabilities can mislead about the causal relevance of C for E. Instead, Kvart urges that we consider ex post facto probabilities of the form P(E | C & D & BC) and P(E | ~C & D & BC), where D is some event that occurs after C but before E. Such an event is called an increaser if P(E | C & D & BC) > P(E | ~C & D & BC). For example, in Hesslow's example, let C be a particular woman's consumption of birth control pills, D be her failure to get pregnant, and E the occurrence of thrombosis. Now we may have ab initio probability decrease, P(E | C & BC) < P(E | ~C & BC), but ex post facto probability increase, P(E | C & D & BC) > P(E | ~C & D & BC). In cases of ab initio probability increase, the trivial event (e.g. the holding of some tautology at a particular time) is an increaser. The existence of an increaser is not sufficient for causation, for an increaser may be reversed or neutralized. That is, there may be a further event F such that P(E | C & D & F & BC) ≤ P(E | ~C & D & F & BC). In particular, cases of probability-raising non-causes involve ab initio probability increase, and hence a trivial increaser, but they are not cases of causation because this probability increase is reversed or neutralized. However, not all neutralizers show that C is not a cause of E. For as noted above in Section 2.5, if F is a causal intermediary between C and E, it will screen off C from E. So on Kvart's account:

(Kvart) C is a cause of E just in case there is a (possibly trivial) increaser for C and E that is not reversed or neutralized, except by events F that are themselves caused by C.

Kvart's account is not reductive, since the right hand side of the bi-conditional refers to causal relations. Nonetheless, the account leads to a decision procedure that appeals to only probabilities, and which will either terminate with a verdict, or fail to terminate, in which case C is a cause of E. First we check whether there is an increaser D, for C and E; if no, then C is not a cause of E. If there is, we must check whether for each increaser to see if it is reversed or neutralized. If there is an increaser that isn't reversed or neutralized, then C is a cause of E. If all increasers are reversed, then C is not a cause of E. If there exists a neutralizer F, we must check to see whether it is caused by C. This involves, first, checking to see whether there is an increaser for C and F. Repeat all of the steps for C and F. If they lead us to a further neutralizer G, we must repeat all the steps for C and G, and so on. If this process fails to terminate, then all neutralizers are caused by C, and C is a cause of E.

Copyright © 2010 by
Christopher Hitchcock <cricky@caltech.edu>

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