Supplement to Chance versus Randomness

D. Chance and Initial Conditions

Toward the end of §5.2, we canvassed the possibility that the initial conditions obtained by chance, and noted that the chances involved seem like very strange creatures indeed. Not being dynamic or process based chances, we were at a loss to understand what they might be.

However, some thoughts about what they could be are found in some recent work of Albert and of Loewer. Albert's particular concern is with explaining thermodynamic asymmetries—that entropy, or disorder, increases towards the future but not the past—while the laws of classical mechanics underlying thermodynamics are time-reversal invariant. Given the standard Lebesgue measure over all possible states, the world is therefore just as likely to end up in a entropy-decreasing world as an entropy-increasing one. But it is a truth about our world that entropy increases; if it cannot be explained by the laws of classical mechanics alone, then classical mechanics will be incomplete as a description of our world, and must needs be supplemented by a further postulate. His preferred additional claim is the past hypothesis, that ‘the world first came into being in whatever low-entropy highly condensed big-bang sort of macrocondition it is that the normal inferential procedures of cosmology will eventually present to us’ (Albert 2000: 96). In conjunction with Newton's laws, the past hypothesis constrains the probability distribution over initial conditions to be one that assigns high probability to low-entropy states, and low probability to other states. This package of assumptions provides a strong and concise description of worlds much like ours. A more accurate description might be provided by a perfect specification of the actual initial condition, but that would be much more complex than the past hypothesis. So the package of Newton's laws plus the assumption that the right measure over initial conditions is one that is uniform over those possible perfectly precise states compatible with the past hypothesis is the best trade off between simplicity and and strength as a description of our world, which is a world in which thermodynamics is a powerful explanatory physical theory. As Loewer (2007: §1) argues (see also his 2001), the past hypothesis and the probabilistic postulate about initial conditions consistent with it therefore deserve to be called laws, as they are part of the a Lewisian best system that describes our world (see Lewis 1994 and also Supplement A.3). Finally, then, they maintain that objective probabilities given by laws of nature deserve to be called chances—so in worlds where thermodynamics is (almost always) correct, there are chances over initial conditions.

If all this works, we have a rationale, at least sometimes, for taking there to be chances of initial conditions. But, firstly, there is room for quite a lot of scepticism about whether it works—see for example the entry on thermodynamic asymmetry in time Callender (2009), as well as Schaffer (2007: §6). And more importantly, if this is the model of explanation, (RCT) is not going to look very plausible. The past hypothesis package is introduced in just those cases where the simple assumption of the uniform measure over all possible initial conditions does not explain the observed facts. It introduces an additional probabilistic claim as a fundamental law, which is what allows it to generate genuine chances. But this probabilistic claim is that the chance of a non-random initial condition—one that is highly orderly—is very high! The outcomes that happen by chance in this theory would yield exactly the kinds of orderly thermodynamic asymmetry we in fact see, and not random sequences at all. To generate random sequences by initial condition chances would involve elevating the ordinary Lebesgue measure to the status of fundamental law. But—and this is the key point—there seems to be no need to take the uniform measure to be a law. The past hypothesis explains something surprising about the regularities we observe; by contrast, a world with random sequences of outcomes is exactly what we should expect a priori if all we knew was which states were possible states. Almost all of them give rise to random sequences, so a world in which such a sequence occurs seems not to need special explanation—we are happy rest content with the initial conditions as a brute fact.

Copyright © 2012 by
Antony Eagle <>

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