Supplement to Chaos

Appendix: Global Lyapunov Exponents

One way to get a handle on global Lyapunov exponents is to see how they arise out of linear stability analysis of the trajectories of evolution equations. Consider the first-order, ordinary differential equation system dx ⁄ dt = Fx and suppose that x* is a steady point, i.e. a point at which F(x*) = 0. We can study the behavior of trajectories near x* by considering x(t) = x* + ε(t), where ε(t) is an infinitesimal perturbation to every component of x. Substituting back into F and expanding to first order in ε(t) (considering only the perturbations at t  =  0 and dropping the explicit dependence on t from ε) yields

(A1) F(x*+ ε) = F(x*) + J(x*)ε + O(ε),

where the matrix J(x) is the n×n Jacobian matrix of partial derivatives of F evaluated at the point x. We then obtain an equation for the time dependence of the perturbation of x, namely

J(x*)ε + O2).

A linear stability analysis results if we neglect terms of ε2 or higher powers in (A2). If ε is a real-valued vector and J a real-valued matrix (i.e., having no complex values), and we assume a solution of the form ε = λest, (A2) reduces to the eigenvalue equation

(A3) Jλ = sλ.

Linear stability analysis can be used to characterize Lyapunov exponents for nonlinear systems of equations. Consider the initial condition x(0) for our first-order system of differential equations and an infinitesimal displacement from x(0) in the direction of some tangent vector, y(0). Then the evolution of y according to (A2) is given by


valid for only an infinitesimal neighborhood about x(0). So the value of the vector y changes in time according to the values J takes on over time. Here y ⁄ |y| gives the direction of the infinitesimal displacement from x, where the bars indicate absolute magnitude. Additionally, |y| ⁄ |y(0)| gives the factor by which the infinitesimal displacement grows (|y|>|y(0)|) or shrinks (|y|<|y(0)|). The Lyapunov exponent is now defined with respect to initial condition x(0) and initial orientation of the infinitesimal displacement y(0) ⁄ |y(0)| as

(A5)   λ(x(0)),
| y(0) |
) = limt→∞ t−1 ln(
dy ⁄ dt
| y(0) |
= limt→∞ t−1 ln(
| J(xy |
| y(0) |
) .

For an n-dimensional system, there will be at most n distinct Lyapunov exponents for a given x(0), and the relevant exponent is picked out by the initial orientation y (0) ⁄ |y(0)|. The infinite time limit plays an important role in this analysis as it indicates that the Lyapunov exponents represent time-averaged quantities (meaning that transient behavior has decayed). The existence of this limit is guaranteed by Oseledec's (1969) multiplicative ergodic theorem, which holds under mild conditions. In addition, J is a constant in space in this limit (otherwise its value varies in space), and the Lyapunov exponents obtained from (A5) are then the same for almost every value of x(0). Hence, one often drops the dependence on the initial condition in (A5). Such exponents are usually called global Lyapunov exponents.

Copyright © 2008 by
Robert Bishop <>

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