Supplement to Temporal Consciousness

Some Relevant Empirical Findings (Psychology, Psychophysics, Neuroscience)


1. Motion Perception

Broad, Clay, Russell, Foster and other realists hold that motion (and other forms of change) can be directly perceived. This notion receives some support from findings relating to the workings of our perceptual systems in general, and the visual system in particular.

Just as there are regions of the brains visual systems that specialize in colour (e.g. V4), there are other regions – V3 and V5 (or MT) – that specialize in motion detection. What is more, some of the systems and pathways devoted to motion are – in evolutionary terms – among the more primitive parts of the brain.[43] Region V5 is particularly intriguing in this respect. It seems that all its neurons are concerned with motion in one direction or another, and none with colour or shape; and unlike V3, the neurons in V5 are concerned with large-scale motion detection, e.g., of whole objects, rather than mere edges. Also, damage to V5 is associated with cerebral akinetopsia: the severely degraded ability to perceive motion, as found in the patient L.M. (Zeki, 1991, 2004; Rizzo et al, 1995). The latter's predicament was characterized thus:

The visual disorder complained of by the patient was a loss of movement in all three dimensions. She had difficulty, for example, in pouring tea or coffee into a cup because the fluid appeared to be frozen, like a glacier. In addition, she could not stop pouring at the right time since she was unable to perceive the movement on the cup (or a pot) when the fluid rose. … In a room where more than two people were walking she felt very insecure and unwell, and usually left the room immediately, because ‘people were suddenly here or there but I have not seen them moving.’ … She could not cross the street because of her inability to judge the speed of a car, but she could identify the car without difficulty. (Zihl, von Cramon & Mai, 1983: 315)

The difference between L.M.'s experience and our own could not be clearer or more dramatic: whereas we are able to see things moving in a smooth, continuous manner, L.M. has lost this ability.

There is plentiful further evidence for the contention that our brains are more than willing to generate experiences of motion. Perhaps the most familiar is the fact that we see moving images on cinema and television screens (and computer monitors). This may not seem in the least surprising: aren't these devices expressly designed to show moving images? In fact, as already noted, the images shown are stills, and the motion we perceive is entirely supplied by our brains. Two main mechanisms are at work in such cases. Suppose two spots are shown, one after the other at different locations on a screen; if the interval between them is sufficiently short, we will not discern the succession: the spots will seem to occur simultaneously. This is due to the well-studied phenomenon of visible persistence. When we are shown a brief visual stimulus, the resulting visual experience is typically a good deal longer than the stimulus itself: e.g., the visible persistence of a single 1 msec flash can vary between 100 msec and 400 msec, depending on the type of flash and the adaptive state of the eye.[44] This effect is one reason why the brief gaps between successive images on a cinema screen tend not seen. It also explains why it is possible to write ones name in the night sky with a moving torch (as noted by both Leonardo and Newton). However, visible persistence alone does not explain how it is that we see motion in the clear and distinct way in which we do. If I wave my hand slowly back and forth in front of my eyes in broad daylight, I do not see it followed by a trail of lingering ghostly predecessors: my hand is cleanly delineated, yet moving. This is explained by an effect first noted by Exner. Returning to our spots-on-a-screen, if the interstimulus interval is increased somewhat, to 20–40 frames per second (fps) something more interesting and dramatic happens: we see the spot moving smoothly back and forth between its left and right positions, despite the fact that all that is really appearing on the screen are two spots of light, at fixed locations, flashing on and off, This is the already-mentioned phi phenomenon, also known as ‘apparent motion’. (The latter designation could be misleading: the motion as it appears is entirely indistinguishable from the real thing.) Evidently, our brains are more than happy to supply us with experiences of motion at the least opportunity. And happily, the effect is not confined to spots of light: it extends to sequences of complex images (e.g., photographs taken in rapid succession of a swarming crowd of people). The frequencies which suffice to generate smooth apparent motion are not great: only 24 fps are shown on cinema screens, whereas television uses 30 fps and computer monitors 60 fps or above.[45] Online examples of the simple two-spot illustration of the phi phenomenon are easy to find, and are well worth experimenting with.[46]

No less dramatic, but somewhat less ubiquitous, is the phenomenon of biological motion. As Johansson (1973) showed, appropriately arranged, a small number of moving dots will give rise to a very vivid impression of a moving human figure. Again, online examples are available – and striking.[47] Morgan sums up thus:

Human vision lies somewhere between the extremes of the [blurry] daguerreotype and the time-frozen electronic flash. We are not normally conscious of a blur in moving objects: nor do we see them frozen in space-time. Instead, we see recognisable objects in motion. Motion is a sensation that cannot be communicated by a single snapshot, but somehow, the sensation of motion can occur without seeing an object in many places at the same time. Motion is a specific sensation, like colour or smell, which cannot be analysed into a separate, stationary sensations. (2003: 61)

Since perceived motion is usually a property of perceptible objects – we cannot discern motion in the absence of moving things – it is probably more correct to talk of motion as a property or feature of sensations. But in other respects what Morgan says here seems plausible.

2. Delays: how long does it take for a stimulus to reach (or produce) consciousness?

It is uncontroversial that the phenomenology of perception is such that we seem to be in immediate perceptual contact with our surroundings. ‘Immediate’ here has two relevant connotations. Firstly, perceptual experience is seemingly unmediated: we are not ordinarily aware of anything (any mental representations or images) coming between ourselves and what we see, hear and touch. Secondly, perceptual experience is seemingly instantaneous in this sense: we ordinarily assume that we perceive events as they happen, with absolutely no time-lag or delay.

This assumption does not sit easily with what we know about the workings of our perceptual systems. Light and sound both travel at a finite speed – if you look at a distant star you are seeing it as it was years earlier, irrespective of how present to you the star might seem. And when the starlight finally reaches our eyes there are several further hurdles to be crossed before any visual experience is produced in response to them: the starlight has to trigger the light-sensitive cells in our retinas, these cells have to transmit signals through the optical nerve, these signals have to be processed by the visual centres of the brain. All this takes time.

How much time? The delay is more difficult to measure than might initially be thought. The obvious approach is to ask a subject to react to a signal as soon as they perceive it – by pressing a button, say – and then subtract the amount of time it takes messages leaving the brain to result in a muscular movement. However, the reliability of this approach is undermined by the fact that we are able to react to stimuli before they become conscious (‘blindsight’ is a familiar instance of this). To circumvent the problem some experimental ingenuity is required. Libet's well-known results, deriving from direct stimulation of the brain during neurosurgical operations, suggest that it typically takes around half a second (500 msec) for a stimulus to work its way through to consciousness (Libet 1993, 2004). However, these results have also been criticized (Churchland 1981; Gomes 1998). Pockett (2002, 2005) suggests that while as much as 500 msec may be required if complicated judgements are being made concerning the data, in other cases stimuli can produce basic sensations in as little as 50–80 msec. This is broadly in line with Efron (1967), who estimates that a minimum of 60–70 msec of neural processing time is required for simple auditory and visual stimului reaching the brain to result in experience. In the visual case, Koch (2004: 260) estimates that around a quarter of a second is typically needed to properly see an object (in the sense of recognizing a thing as a thing of a particular kind).

The answer to our starting question seems to be ‘it depends’. And while those with an interest in responding to changes in their environment in a fast, real-time, manner will be heartened to learn that Libet's 500 msec estimate may often be on the long side, it remains the case that a car moving at a 100 kph traverses a fair distance in 200–250 msec, which even under the best of conditions is the sort of time needed to see and respond to a traffic light changing to red, or someone stepping onto the road. Even at more modest speeds processing delays will have a significant impact: a delay of just 100 msec mean that the apparent position of a medium-paced moving ball – say 30 mph – will lag behind its real position by over a metre.

3. Thresholds of Simultaneity, Succession and Integration

James posed this question:

what then is the minimum amount of duration which we can distinctly feel? The smallest figure experimentally obtained was by Exner, who distinctly heard the doubleness of two successive clicks of a Savart's wheel, and of two successive snaps of an electric spark, when their interval was made as small as about one five-hundredth of a second [2msec]. With the eye, perception is less delicate. Two sparks, made to fall beside each other in rapid succession on the centre of the retina, ceased to be recognized as successive by Exner when their interval fell below 0.044 second [44msec] (1890: 613)

These 19th century figures have largely survived the test of time. Pockett (2003) recently attempted to replicate Exner's findings using contemporary equipment. When shown two 1 msec flashes of LED light in succession her subjects only began to see two flashes (rather than one) when the illuminations were separated by at least 45–50 msec – very much in line with Exner's results. In the auditory case, although subjects could tell that a two-click stimulus was (in some manner) different from a 1-click stimulus when the clicks were separated by as little as 2 msec – the stimuli were again 1 msec in duration – they could only begin to discern two clearly distinct sounds when the separation rose to 10–20 msec, depending on the subject. This result suggests Exner somewhat exaggerated our capacity for auditory discrimination. Pöppel's measurements also suggest as much: irrespective of modality he found that distinct events require a separation of at least 30 msec to be perceived as successive (1997: 57). Hirsch and Sherrick's experiments also point in this direction: they found that a mere 2 msec separation between sounds was sufficient for subjects to judge that two sounds were occurring rather than one, but an interval in the order of 20 msec was required before subjects could reliably discern the order of the sounds (1961: 425). However, as Fraisse (1984) notes, since it took a good deal of practice before Hirsch and Sherrick's subjects achieved this score, a somewhat higher figure may come closer to the norm. Hence Pöppel's more cautious verdict may well be closer to the mark for most cases. Summarizing, the picture is something like this:

Coincidence (or fusion) thresholds: ~2–3 msec for auditory stimuli, ~10 msec for tactile stimuli and ~20 msec for visual stimuli.

Succession threshold: ~30 msec, irrespective of modality.

Pairs of stimuli which are separated by less than the coincidence threshold are experienced as one rather than two. Stimuli which are separated by more than the coincidence threshold but less than the succession threshold are experienced as two rather than one, but their order is indistinct. It is only when the succession threshold is reached and surpassed that stimuli appear to have a distinct temporal ordering (Ruhnau 1995). The fact that the succession threshold is much the same for all sensory modalities suggests that cross-modal integrative mechanisms may well exist.

Why do our brains treat stimuli which arrive over brief intervals as simultaneous? It is by no means just a matter of insensitivity. Not only do sound and light travel at very different speeds, our eyes and ears work at different speeds too (our ears are faster). Consequently, our brains have a good deal to take into account when attempting to work out what happens when and where on the basis of the information it receives from millisecond to millisecond. For more on how it manages to do as well as it does see King (2005), Kopinska and Harris (2004), Stone et al (2001), Stetson et al (2006); see Callender (2008) for an interesting exploration of the philosophical relevance of perceptual ‘simultaneity windows’.

In addition to the limits already mentioned there is what is sometimes called the ‘integration threshold’. Distinct brief stimuli which occur within the confines of the latter can be blended (or integrated) so as to produce a single experience, the character of which can be surprising. If a small red disk is shown in for 10 msec and is immediately followed by 10 msec exposure of a small green disk at the same location, the resulting experience is of a single yellow flash. If a 20 msec blue light is followed by a 20 msec yellow light, a single white flash is seen. (Efron, 1967, 1973) It is clear how long this integration period lasts, but it is probably less than a quarter of second (Koch 2004: 256).

This sort of integration is sometimes construed as a special case of the more general phenomenon of backward masking. Visual masking per se occurs when the appearance of one stimuli – the target – is affected by the visibility of a second stimuli, the mask. Backward masking is so-called because the mask occurs after the target. In one illustration of this effect subjects are shown brief exposures of two different shapes at the same location, and asked name each of the shapes. When the distance between the exposures is between 50–100 msec, the second shape is accurately identified around 70% of the time, whereas accuracy for the shape seen first lies around 30% (Bachman and Allik, 1976). The effect is typically at its strongest when the mask follows the target by approximately 100 msec, and diminishes rapidly thereafter. For a recent review of this topic see Breitmeyer and Ogden (2000).

4. Minimally Brief Experiences of Duration

Do the various findings concerning coincidence and succession thresholds tell us anything about the temporal extent of minimally brief experiences of duration or succession? Probably, but there are complications.

We have just seen that stimuli separated by as little as 30 msec can give rise to an experience of succession. However, it would be a mistake to move directly from this result to the conclusion that the duration of the resulting experiences are also have an objective duration of the order of 30 msec (and a corresponding phenomenal duration of approximately 30 msec*). As we have also seen, due to the phenomenon known as visible persistence, the experience resulting from a single 1 msec flash of light can vary between 100 msec and 400 msec, depending on the brightness of the flash and how adapted the eye is to the relevant brightness conditions.

So what should we conclude? The literature contains a range of estimates. Pöppel tells us that Ernst Mach, who had an interest in the discrimination of different temporal durations: ‘observed that there is no experience of duration for intervals that are shorter than 40 msec. Stimuli with 40 msec duration or shorter are experienced as “time points” ’ (2004 :296) But for the reason just given, this does not tell us how long – in ordinary clock time – these subjectively durationless experiences last. Drawing on evidence from a range of experiments, Allport, Stroud and other proponents of the ‘perceptual moment’ hypothesis (see Section 5, below) estimated that typical experiential quanta were of the order of 100 msec. Other estimates suggest a perceptual minima of longer duration. Efron was notably careful in distinguishing the duration of stimuli and the durations of the resulting sensory experiences. His investigations of subjects asked to compare the durations of immediately successive auditory and visual sensations led him to conclude that ‘a minimal perceptual duration is produced by all stimuli of 120–130 msec or less, and that the duration of this minimum perception lies between 120 and 240 msec for vision and between 120 and 170 msec for audition.’ (1970b: 62). Coren, Ward and Enns sum up a confusing situation thus: ‘the best that we can say at this time is that, depending on the specific task, the minimum perceptual duration … is probably between 25 and 150 msec’ (2004: 351).

While Extensional models do not predict a minimum perceptual duration, they have no difficulty accommodating it. What of Retentional models? There is no difficulty here either. Retentionalists may hold that individual specious presents are experiential episodes with little or no temporal extension, but since the contents of these experiences present (or represent) temporally extended phenomena, they too can accommodate minimal perceived durations.

5. Is Experience Continuous or Discrete?

In §5.2 we encountered the ‘discrete block’ conception: according to some philosophers (e.g., Bradley, Sprigge, Whitehead) our streams of consciousness are composed of non-overlapping sequences of Jamesian duration-blocks. To put it another way, our experience is chunked or quantized. This model has its merits – it offers a phenomenologically plausible account of individual specious presents – it is also problematic: if awareness of phenomenal continuity is confined to the interiors of non-overlapping duration-blocks, it is hard to see how our experience could be as continuous as it is often thought to be.

Something superficially akin to the discrete block model has been entertained by a number of psychologists. According to proponents of the ‘perceptual moment’ hypothesis, the workings of our sensory systems are discrete rather than continuous. As Allport puts it, the assumption is that ‘at some stage in the nervous system, the sensory input is packaged for analysis into successive, temporally discrete samples, or “chunks”. Underlying this suggestion is the idea that the brain operates in some way discontinuously in time on its inputs’ (1968: 395); also see Stroud (1955). The duration of the chunks or moments (or frames) is typically taken to be of the order of 100 msec.

Most proponents of this approach combine the claim that sensory processing operates in a discrete manner with the further claim that stimuli presented within any given perceptual windows appear simultaneous (or are not distinguishable from one another at all); only stimuli which are presented in distinct perceptual moments give rise to experiences which seem successive. Thus construed, perceptual moments are manifestly very different from the discrete specious presents of Bradley, Sprigge and Whitehead: the contents of the latter are typically not simultaneous, containing as they do phenomenal duration and succession. However, as Allport suggests (ibid. 396), there is no a priori reason why discrete perceptual processing should lead to a complete loss of information regarding the temporal order of stimuli occurring within individual perceptual moments. If so, it is at least logically possible for stimuli occurring within perceptual moments to give rise to experiences of duration and succession.[48]

Although there are results which can be taken as supportive of the discrete processing model, over the past half century or so it has gradually fallen from favour. Efron conducted a series of experiments on auditory and visual experience to test two hypotheses: (a) that a perception has a minimum duration, and (b) that perceptual durations occur only in exact multiples of this minimum (the quantization hypothesis). He found no support for the latter: ‘auditory and visual perceptions have a minimum duration, produced by stimuli shorter than the critical duration, and that perceptions evoked by longer than this critical value are continuously graded with respect to duration’ (1970: 54). In recent years the quantized conception has found renewed favour in some quarters, e.g., Purves, Paydarfar & Andrews (1996) and VanRullen & Koch (2003), but the supporting evidence is less than wholly compelling. In a recent review Kline et al conclude ‘while quantized perception cannot be ruled out, there currently exists little meaningful evidence in support of it’ (2004: 2658).

In its standard form the perceptual moment hypothesis is in tension with our ability to perceive motion. It is by no means clear how we could perceive motion if (i) our streams of consciousness are composed of discrete (non-overlapping) perceptual moments, and (ii) the experiential contents of each perceptual moment are (phenomenally speaking) simultaneous. For Crick and Koch, however, there is no problem here at all. According to their ‘snapshot hypothesis’ (2003: 122), consciousness not only comes in discrete chunks, the experience of motion is itself illusory:

Perception might well take place in discrete processing epochs, perceptual moments, frames, or snapshots. Your subjective life could be a ceaseless sequence of such frame … Within one such moment, the perception of brightness, colour, depth and motion would be constant. Think of motion painted onto each snapshot … (Koch 2004: 264)

But as we saw in §4.4, this view is not without its difficulties.

Copyright © 2010 by
Barry Dainton <bdainton@liverpool.ac.uk>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free