Notes to The Continuum Hypothesis

1. See Hallett (1984) for further historical information on the role of CH in the early foundations of set theory.

2. We have of necessity presupposed much in the way of set theory. The reader seeking additional detail—for example, the definitions of regular and singular cardinals and other fundamental notions—is directed to one of the many excellent texts in set theory, for example Jech (2003).

3. To say that GCH holds below δ is just to say that 2α = ℵα+1 for all ω ≤ α < δ and to say that GCH holds at δ is just to say that 2δ = ℵδ+1).

4. To see this argue as follows: Assume large cardinal axioms at the level involved in (A) and (B) and assume that there is a proper class of Woodin cardinals. Suppose for contradiction that there is a prewellordering in L(ℝ) of length ℵ2. Now, using (A) force to obtain a saturated ideal on ℵ2 without collapsing ℵ2. In this forcing extension, the original prewellordering is still a prewellordering in L(ℝ) of length ℵ2, which contradicts (B). Thus, the original large cardinal axioms imply that ΘL(ℝ) ≤ ℵ2. The same argument applies in the more general case where the prewellordering is universally Baire.

5. For more on the topic of invariance under set forcing and the extent to which this has been established in the presence of large cardinal axioms, see §4.4 and §4.6 of the entry “Large Cardinals and Determinacy”.

6. The non-stationary ideal INS is a proper class from the point of view of H2) and it manifests (through Solovay’s theorem on splitting stationary sets) a non-trivial application of AC. For further details concerning AG see §4.6 of the entry “Large Cardinals and Determinacy”.

7. Here are the details: Let A ∈ Γ and M be a countable transitive model of ZFC. We say that M is A-closed if for all set generic extensions M[G] of M, AM[G] ∈ M[G]. Let T be a set of sentences and φ be a sentence. We say that TΩ φ if there is a set A ⊆ ℝ such that

  1. L(A, ℝ) ⊧ AD+,
  2. 𝒫 (ℝ) ∩ L(A, ℝ) ⊆ Γ, and
  3. for all countable transitive A-closed M,
    M ⊧ “TΩ φ”,

    where here AD+ is a strengthening of AD.

8. Here are the details: First we need another conjecture: (The AD+ Conjecture) Suppose that A and B are sets of reals such that L(A, ℝ) and L(B, ℝ) satisfy AD+. Suppose every set

X ∈ 𝒫 (ℝ) ∩ (L(A, ℝ) ∪ L(B, ℝ))

is ω1-universally Baire. Then either

(Δ̰21)L(A,ℝ) ⊆ (Δ̰21)L(B,ℝ)


(Δ̰21)L(B,ℝ) ⊆ (Δ̰21)}L(A,ℝ).

(Strong Ω conjecture) Assume there is a proper class of Woodin cardinals. Then the Ω Conjecture holds and the AD+ Conjecture is Ω-valid.

9. As mentioned at the end of Section 2.2 it could be the case (given our present knowledge) that large cardinal axioms imply that ΘL(ℝ) < ℵ3 and, more generally, rule out the definable failure of 20 = ℵ2. This would arguably further buttress the case for 20 = ℵ2.

Copyright © 2013 by
Peter Koellner <>

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