Notes to Contradiction

1. Leibniz regarded the Law of Identity (A=A or ∀x(x=x)) as a more basic formulation than the Law of Non-Contradiction because the former is an affirmative principle while the latter, which rules out an A which is not an A, can only be the most basic of the negative truths. However, Leibniz's assumption that LNC can be derived from the Law of Identity is not generally accepted. Indeed, while the Law of Identity is sometimes reckoned as one of the three indemonstrable principles along with LNC and LEM (the Law of Excluded Middle, discussed in §2), Aristotle does not himself advocate this position. This did not stop the city of Berkeley, California from considering a petition drive to raise the principle that “every entity shall be identical to itself” to the status of statutory law, with violators (“any entity caught being unidentical to itself”) being subject to a fine of up to one tenth of a cent, although the attempt was ultimately unsuccessful. This may be seen as confirming that the Law of Identity is not a basic principle; after all, LNC and LEM advocates can retort, “Petition drive? We don't need no stinkin' petition drive!”

2. Anyone who rejects the basic criterion of contradictory opposition, viz. “the denial is false whenever the assertion is true, and the affirmation is false whenever the denial is true”, is committed to the view “that all speak alike falsely and truly”. But such a rejectionist “can neither speak nor mean anything” (Metaphysics 1008a35-b12). Not everyone has found the reductio arguments in Metaphysics Γ for the non-demonstrable status of LNC as convincing as Aristotle did (cf. Barnes 1969 and Dialetheism). Łukasiewicz, for one, sought to show that LNC does not have the primacy it receives in the Metaphysics; its value, he submits, is not “logical” but “ethical”, serving as “a weapon against error and falsehood”, and in particular as a useful tool for a defendant seeking to establish his innocence in a criminal proceeding (Łukasiewicz 1910/1971: 508). But even such a lukewarm endorsement of LNC as a suspiciously grounded “unassailable dogma” would be rejected by skeptics, neo-Sophists, and others who have chosen (out of perversity or error, Aristotle would insist) to march to the beat of a different drummer. Some of the arguments of these conscientious objectors to LNC are surveyed below.

3. For Aristotle, even terms like “green” and “non-green” would not be in contradictory opposition; as with “sick” and “well” discussed in the text below, neither of the two terms can be affirmed of non-existent objects and neither applies to those not falling naturally within the range of objects that can be colored (e.g. to abstract concepts); Santa Claus and sincerity are neither green nor non-green. Thus the F and non-F terms constitute contrary and not contradictory opposites.

4. The rejection of LEM cannot take the form of ¬(Φ ∨ ¬Φ), since this amounts by the usual De Morgan equivalence to the conjunction (¬Φ & ¬¬Φ), which in turn by LDN reduces to (¬Φ & Φ), a direct rejection of the LNC. A rejection of LEM should be understood instead as a denial that LEM is necessary, i.e. as a negation of (3b) below; no violation of LNC thereby ensues. Alternatively, one may refrain from assenting to either (Φ ∨ ¬Φ) or ¬(Φ ∨ ¬Φ)

5. And allowing, as well, its own group of dissenters, including Kierkegaard, for whom Christ both is a man and is not a man (at the same time, and presumably in the same respect). Yet this proposition can only constitute the serious paradox Kierkegaard intends if LNC is generally valid.

6. Matters are not quite so simple. On some versions of dialetheism (e.g. Priest 1998) the LNC is not necessarily repudiated as such, given the distinction between the denial of a proposition and the assertion of its negation. Strictly speaking, we can accept every statement reducible to the form ¬(Φ & ¬Φ) and thereby affirm a version of the LNC, while at the same time accepting some (although of course not all) contradictions of the form (Φ & ¬Φ). (I am indebted to an anonymous reader for clarifying this point; see also the papers in the “Against the LNC” section of Priest et al. 2004.)

7. For example: “The property of true and the property of false, which are contradictory, could not apply to one and the same thing” (Kumārila, Mīmāmsā 16.43ab).

8. Cf. Balcerowicz 2003 for a parallel point concerning the status of LNC and LEM in Jaina logic.

Copyright © 2010 by
Laurence R. Horn <laurence.horn@yale.edu>

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