Supplement to Death

The Argument: Death and Posthumous Events Don't Affect Us

Here is a more explicit version of 1-13 (with thanks to Curtis Brown):

Let s,s′, … range over subjects; v,v′, … over events and states; and t,t′, … over times. We can use the following abbreviations:

SD(v,s,t): v is the state of s being dead at t
harm2(v,s): v harms s
harm3(v,s,t): v harms s at t
t > t’: t is after t’
tt’: t is after t’ or t = t’

We can use the following function symbols:

For any subject s, ED(s) is the event of s’s death

For any event or state v, T(v) is the time v occurs or holds

Next come axioms:

A1: vs(harm2(v,s) iff ∃tharm3(v,s,t))
A2: vs(v is posthumous for s iff T(v) > T(ED(s)))
A3: vst(If SD(v,s), then t > T(ED(s)))

Then premises:

P1: vst(If v affects s at t, then v causally affects s at t)
P2: vst(If v causally affects s at t, then s exists at t)
P3: vst(If harm3(v,s,t), then v affects s at t)
P4: vst(If v causally affects s at t, then t ≥ T(v))
P5: vs(If t > T(ED(s)), then it is not the case that s exists at t)

Here are the conclusions to be reached:

C1: No posthumous event harms us; i.e.,
vs(If v is posthumous for s, then ~harm2(v,s))
C2: We are not harmed by the state of our being dead; i.e.,
vst(If SD(v,s,t), then ~harm2(v,s))
C3: The event of death harms us, if at all, only when it occurs; i.e.,
vst(If v=ED(s) & harm3(v,s,t), then t = T(ED(s)))

Argument for C1:

Let v1 be any event or state, s1 any subject and t1 any time.

1.  v1 is posthumous for s1 (assumption for conditional introduction)
2.  harm2(v1, s1) (assumption for reductio ad absurdum)
3.  T(v1) > T(ED(s1)) (1, A2, UI, biconditional elimination)
4.  harm3(v1, s1,t) (2, A1, UI, biconditional elimination, MP)
5.  harm3(v1, s1, t1) (4, EI)
6.  v1 affects s1 at t1 (5, P3, UI, MP)
7.  v1 causally affects s1 at t1 (6, P1, UI, MP)
8.  t1 > T(v1) (7, P4, UI, MP)
9.  t1 > T(ED(s1)) (8, 3, transitivity of >)
10.  ~s1 exists at t1 (9, P5, UI, MP)
11.  s1 exists at t1 (7, P2, UI, MP)
12.  ~harm2(v1, s1) (2, 10,11, reductio ad absurdum
13.  If v1 is posthumous for s1, then ~harm2(v1, s1) (1, 13, conditional introduction)
14.  vs(If v is posthumous for s, then ~harm2(v,s)) (13 UG)

Argument for C2:

Let v1 be any event or state, s1 any subject and t1 any time.

1.  SD(v1, s1, t1) (assumption for conditional introduction)
2.  t1 > T(ED(s1)) (1, A3, UI, MP))
3.  v1 is posthumous for s1 (2, A2, biconditional elimination)
4.  ~harm2(v1, s1) (3, C1, UI, MP)
5.  If SD(v1, s1, t1), then
~harm2(v1, s1)
(1, 4, CI)
6.  vst(If SD(v,s,t), then ~harm2(v,s)) (5, UG)

Argument for C3:

Let v1 be any event or state, s1any subject and t1 any time.

1.  v1 = ED(s1) & harm3(v1, s1, t1) (assumption for conditional introduction)
2.  harm3(ED(s1), s1, t1) (1, simplication, substitution)
3.  ED(s1) affects s1 at t1 (2, P3, UI, MP)
4.  ED(s1) causally affects s1 at t1 (3, P1, UI, MP)
5.  t1 ≥ T(ED(s1)) (4, P4, UI, MP)
6.  t1 > T(ED(s1)) (assumption for reductio ad absurdum)
7.  ~s1 exists at t1 (6, P5, UI, MP)
8.  s1 exists at t1 (4, P2, UI, MP)
9.  ~t1 > T(ED(s1)) (6, 8, reductio ad absurdum)
10.  t1 = T(ED(s1)) (5, 9, disjunctive syllogism)
11.  If v1=ED(s1) & harm3(v1,s1,t1), then t1 = T(ED(s1)) (1, 10, conditional introduction)
12.  vst(If v=ED(s) & harm3(v,s,t), then t = T(ED(s)) (11, UG)

Copyright © 2009 by
Steven Luper <sluper@trinity.edu>

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