Descartes' Theory of Ideas

First published Wed Mar 14, 2007; substantive revision Mon Jan 14, 2013

Ideas are among the most important items in Cartesian philosophy. They serve to unify Descartes' ontology and epistemology. As he says in a letter to Guillaume Gibieuf (1583–1650), dated 19 January 1642, “I am certain that I can have no knowledge of what is outside me except by means of the ideas I have within me.”[1] Descartes never produced any formal treatise or work dedicated specifically to the laying out of a theory of ideas. Even so, enough is included in published and unpublished work, as well as in correspondence, that allows for a basic reconstruction of a theory. This entry will focus principally on the theory of ideas and how it relates to Descartes' ontology. See the related entry Descartes, René: epistemology for more on how the theory relates to Descartes' epistemology.

1. Ideas are Modes of Thought

According to Descartes' ontology there are three levels of being: substance, attribute, and mode. The levels of being are understood in terms of ontological dependence. Modes depend on attributes for their being in a way that attributes do not depend on modes. And, attributes depend on substances for their being in a way that substances do not depend on attributes. In Principles, Part I, Article 53, for example, the language that Descartes uses is that of “presupposition.” He claims that modes presuppose attributes (AT VIIIA 25; CSM I 210); and, in Article 52, he claims that attributes presuppose an existing substance (AT VIIIA 25; CSM I 210).

The essence or nature of a mind, Descartes says, is to think. If a thing does not think, it is not a mind. In terms of his ontology, the mind is a (finite) substance, and thought or thinking is its attribute. Insofar as the essence or nature of a mind is to think, where thought is the mind's defining feature, Descartes calls it the mind's principal attribute (AT VIIIA 25; CSM I 210–11). An idea is a mode of thought.[2] In light of the way that Descartes employed the concept of mode, to say that something is a mode of X is to say that it is a way of being X. Thus, in being a mode of thought, an idea is understood as a way of being thought (or a way in which an instance of thought or thinking is manifested). This is similar to what he says about a body, its principal attribute, and its modes. The essence or nature of a body is to be extended (in length, breadth, and depth). A body is a (finite) substance, and extension is its attribute. Since extension is the defining feature of a body, Descartes refers to it as a body's principal attribute. Shape, for example, is a mode of extension. What this means is that shape is a way of being extended (or a way in which an instance of extension is manifested). Thus, shape is to extension as idea is to thought.

Insofar as ideas are modes, they occupy the lowest rung on Descartes' ontological ladder. This can be contrasted to Plato's theory, for example, which casts ideas as substances, occupying the upper-most rung of the ontological ladder. So, whereas for Plato ideas are the most real things in the cosmos, for Descartes ideas are among the least real.

Ideas are not the only modes of thought. For example, doubting and judging are modes of thought. Even so, according to at least one analysis Descartes provides, ideas are understood as being elements or constituents of these other modes of thought. Early in the Third Meditation, for instance, Descartes works out a basic division of the modes of thought. He sorts them into two basic kinds: ideas and the other modes of thought, which are more complex since they include an idea and some “additional” mental feature. He writes:

First, however, considerations of order appear to dictate that I now classify my thoughts into definite kinds, and ask which of them can properly be said to be the bearers of truth and falsity. Some of my thoughts are as it were the images of things, and it is only in these cases that the term 'idea' is strictly appropriate — for example, when I think of a man, or a chimera, or the sky, or an angel, or God. Other thoughts have various additional forms: thus when I will, or am afraid, or affirm, or deny, there is always a particular thing which I take as the object of my thought, but my thought includes something more than the likeness of that thing. Some thoughts in this category are called volitions or emotions, while others are called judgements. (AT VII 36–7; CSM II 25–6)

In this passage, ideas are cast as modes of thought that represent (or present or exhibit — Descartes uses such terms interchangeably) “objects” to the mind. Strictly speaking, it is the only kind of mode that does this. For, even though an instance of one of the more complex modes of thought presents an “object” to the mind, as in the case of one's fearing a lion or affirming the Pythagorean Theorem (where the lion and the theorem are the “objects” presented), it is the ideational element (the idea) that does the presenting. Even so, Descartes is careful to not identify ideas as pictures or as visual images, but instead says that they are as it were [tanquam] images of things. This is a long-standing theme, for we find it expressed as early as The World (AT XI 3–6; CSM I 81–2) and the Optics (AT VI 112–13; CSM I 165), and as late as the Principles (AT VIIIA 32–3; CSM I 216–17), where in these contexts ideas are cast as representing their objects without necessarily resembling them. This is important to the theory, since the idea of cold or the idea of sweet, for example, insofar as they are ideas, represent something to the mind, but they are not visual images. The point holds for other ideas, such as the idea of God, which he explicitly lists in the above passage. The idea of God represents something to the mind (it represents an infinite substance), but in line with traditional theological doctrine, which demands that God is non-spatial and non-temporal, such an idea must not be understood as being a visual image of God. Descartes' qualifying tanquam (as it were) phrase appears to align his theory with such theological demands.

Consistent with what he says in the above Third Meditation passage, Descartes says in other places that an idea is “the form of any given thought, immediate perception of which makes me aware of the thought” (AT VII 160; CSM II 113). In his reply to Thomas Hobbes (1588–1679), author of the Third Set of Objections, Descartes says that an idea is “whatever is immediately perceived by the mind” (AT VII 181; CSM II 127). In his reply to Pierre Gassendi (1592–1655), author of the Fifth Set of Objections, he says that the term “idea” is extended “to cover any object of thought” (AT VII 366; CSM II 253). In a letter to Marin Mersenne (1588–1648), dated July 1641, he says that “idea” denotes “in general everything which is in our mind when we conceive something, no matter how we conceive it” (AT III 393; CSMK III 185). Traditionally, scholars have interpreted such passages as telling us that Descartes' view is that in an idea's representing or presenting an object to the mind, it is a mode that in some sense possesses content (Wilson 1978, Chappell 1986). This has in turn led scholars to interpret Descartes' theory as being among the earlier theories of intentionality. This finds further support in what Descartes says, for example, in the First Replies: “…the idea of the sun is the sun itself existing in the intellect — not of course formally existing, as it does in the heavens, but objectively existing, i.e., in the way in which objects normally are in the intellect” (AT VII 102–3; CSM II 75). Such an object is solely in the intellect, “…it is not an actual entity, that is, it is not a being located outside the intellect…” (AT VII 103; CSM II 75) According to this interpretation, Descartes understands the objects represented or presented to the mind, objects that are in some sense in ideas, as intentional (and purely mental) objects. Such objects are those of which the mind is immediately aware.

2. Three Kinds of Idea

In the Meditations, after Descartes casts ideas as modes that represent objects to the mind, he divides ideas into kinds. He says:

Among my ideas, some appear to be innate, some to be adventitious, and others to have been invented by me. My understanding of what a thing is, what truth is, and what thought is, seems to derive simply from my own nature. But my hearing a noise, as I do now, or seeing the sun, or feeling the fire, comes from things which are located outside me, or so I have hitherto judged. Lastly, sirens, hippogriffs and the like are my own invention. (AT VII 37–8; CSM II 26)

Here, Descartes considers three kinds of idea: innate ideas, adventitious ideas, and what are sometimes called factitious ideas. The categories are determined by what appears to him to be differences with respect to the origins of their contents. It will not be until later in the Third Meditation, and arguably not until the Sixth Meditation, that the three categories will be confirmed as genuine. The first category poses no difficulties, for he suggests that he can account for these ideas (their contents) — specifically the ideas of what a thing is, what thought is, and so on — by an appeal to his own nature. He is an existent thinking thing, and so the origin of the contents of the ideas he mentions, the objects they represent, can be traced to this fact about his nature. The last category of idea is also unproblematic, for he can easily account for them again by an appeal to himself. He puts them together, so to speak, out of other ideas that he already possesses. Adventitious ideas, however, do pose an immediate problem, since Nature has always taught him, he says, to think that they are “derived from things existing outside me” (AT VII 38; CSM II 26). So, an account of their origin — that is, the origin of their content — may have to include an appeal to things that exist external to, or independently of, his mind. The problem is that at this stage in the Meditations certain forms of doubt that have yet to be resolved prohibit his adopting the view that there exist such things.

The belief that some of his ideas have their origin in things that exist external to, or independently of, his mind arises in part from ordinary (pre-philosophical) experience: “…I know by experience that these ideas do not depend on my will, and hence that they do not depend simply on me. Frequently I notice them even when I do not want to: now, for example, I feel the heat whether I want to or not, and this is why I think that this sensation or idea of heat comes to me from something other than myself, namely the heat of the fire by which I am sitting” (AT VII 38; CSM II 26). Although Descartes begins the analysis by an initial examination of adventitious ideas, he ultimately extends it to cover the idea of God, which is the paradigm of an innate idea. For, as we learn just a few pages later in the Third Meditation, the idea of God is innate, and yet, as Descartes shows, it (or its content) must have its origin in God, the infinite substance, something that exists external to, or independently of, Descartes' finite mind.

This is not the only place where the distinction between the categories of innate and adventitious ideas is blurred. It arises again, for instance, in Comments on a Certain Broadsheet, published in 1648. There, Descartes casts innateness as a faculty (capacity) or tendency (AT VIIIB 358; CSM I 304), which aligns with what he had said in the Third Replies: “…when we say that an idea is innate in us, we do not mean that it is always there before us. This would mean that no idea was innate. We simply mean that we have within ourselves the faculty of summoning up the idea” (AT VII 189; CSM II 132). Descartes then turns, in Comments on a Certain Broadsheet, to applying this view to what in the Meditations were called adventitious ideas. Given that the human or embodied mind has the faculty or capacity to have sensory or adventitious ideas of pains, colors, sounds, and so on, occasioned on the occurrence or presence of certain motions in the brain, and nothing of the motions is transferred to the mind, and nothing resembling the pains, colors, and sounds are present in bodies, then the ideas of pains, colors, and sounds, he says, “must be all the more innate” (AT VIIIB 359; CSM I 304). Their possibility is in part rooted in an innate capacity of an embodied mind. And so, his adventitious ideas look to be innate in this sense.

One interpretation that resolves the above conflict casts innate ideas as ideas that underlie all other ideas, where the relationship between the innate ideas and all other ideas is understood in terms of the conditions of intelligibility (Nolan 1997, Lennon 2007, Nelson 2008). Consider, for example, the idea of the sun. Understood as a shaped thing, an analysis of this idea would reveal that the innate idea of extension (body) is in play, so to speak, for without it we simply could not conceive (or experience) the sun as shaped. Shape, recall, presupposes extension. As Descartes puts it in the Principles, everything “which can be attributed to body presupposes extension, and is merely a mode of an extended thing,” and so, “…shape is unintelligible except in an extended thing…” (AT VIIIA 25; CSM I 210). In this sense, insofar as a shaped thing is intelligible to us, which is to say that we have an idea of such a thing, the innate idea of extension is present. As some scholars have put it, the innate idea underlies the occurring idea of shape (Nolan 1997, Nelson 2008). This interpretation finds support in what Descartes says in a letter to Princess Elisabeth, dated 21 May 1643, where he introduces what he calls the “primitive notions.” These are what in other contexts he calls the innate ideas. He claims that they are “…the patterns on the basis of which we form all our other conceptions” (AT III 665; CSMK III 218). According to this reading, there is a sense in which innate ideas are always present, which puts pressure on the innateness equals capacity view, noted above. According to this reading, adventitious ideas rely on the innate ideas in the sense that the latter account for the intelligibility of the former. Consequently, the blurring between the categories of innate and adventitious ideas is resolved.

Despite the tensions that arise among the above-considered interpretations, scholars from both camps agree that with respect to innate ideas, Descartes recognizes at least three: the idea of God, the idea of (finite) mind, and the idea of (indefinite) body.

3. Ideas and The Formal-Objective Reality Distinction

There are two very important kinds of being or reality in Cartesian philosophy, namely, formal and objective being or reality. Some scholars have argued that for Descartes there is a difference between the concepts of being and reality (Chappell 1986, Lennon 2007, Smith 2010a). This distinction will be ignored in what follows, and focus will be given to what scholars call the formal-objective reality distinction. And so, in this context being and reality will be taken as coextensive. The formal-objective reality distinction serves as one of the basic building blocks of Descartes' theory of ideas.

The formal reality of a thing is the reality the thing possesses in virtue of its being an actual or an existent thing (AT VII 41–42, 102–4; CSM II 28–29, 74–5). The objective reality of a thing, on the other hand, is the reality a thing possesses in virtue of its being a representation of something (ibid.). Within the scheme of Cartesian metaphysics, only ideas will possess objective reality, and they will possess this kind of reality by their very nature (AT VII 42; CSM II 29).

There are two distinct hierarchies with respect to both kinds of reality. Concerning formal reality, there are three “levels”: infinite substance, finite substance (as defined by its principal attribute), and mode. A finite substance depends for its reality on the reality of the infinite substance in a way that the reality of the infinite substance does not depend for its reality on the reality of a finite substance. And, similarly, a mode depends for its reality on the reality of a finite substance in a way that a finite substance does not depend for its reality on the reality of a mode. Another way to put this, thinking specifically in terms of formal reality, is that the formal reality of a thing in the category of mode is derived from the formal reality of a thing in the category of finite substance, and the formal reality of a thing in the category of finite substance is derived from the formal reality of a thing in the category of infinite substance. As we shall see in a passage to be considered shortly, it is Descartes' view that an infinite substance possesses a greater level of formal reality than a finite substance, and that a finite substance possesses a greater level of formal reality than a mode. Concerning objective reality, Descartes says, “Undoubtedly, the ideas which represent substances to me amount to something more and, so to speak, contain within themselves more objective reality than the ideas which merely represent modes or accidents” (AT VII 40; CSM II 28). And, Descartes' Third Meditation examination of his idea of God will reveal that the objective reality that it contains or possesses is that of an infinite substance. At the very least, the view is that the idea of God contains a level of objective reality that is greater than that contained in an idea representing a finite substance. Thus, the levels of objective reality possessed by ideas, the reality they possess in virtue of their representing things to the mind, are three: infinite substance, finite substance, and mode. So, the categories of the objective-reality hierarchy correspond to those of the formal-reality hierarchy. One important difference, however, is that whereas in the formal-reality hierarchy objects in one category, those in the category of mode, for example, are understood as depending for their being on the being of those objects in the higher category, in this case those in the category of finite substance, it is not clear whether the objects in the objective-reality hierarchy share the same ontological dependence relationship. That is, it is not clear whether a mode represented in an idea (this would be an idea whose level of objective reality is that of a mode) depends ontologically on anything whose objective reality is that of the level of a finite substance. As we shall see shortly, the level of objective reality in an idea, at least with respect to what Descartes will call primary ideas, is derived from an object possessing some level of formal reality that is either greater than or equal to the level of objective reality contained in the idea. So, the same relation that holds between objects in the formal-reality hierarchy may not hold for objects in the objective-reality hierarchy. A neutral reading of this would simply hold that the objective-reality hierarchy is determined by the formal-reality hierarchy, where the latter is determined by the asymmetrical ontological dependence relationships noted earlier.

“The nature of an idea,” Descartes says, “is such that of itself it requires no formal reality except what it derives from my thought, of which it is a mode” (AT VII 41; CSM II 28). In fact, “In so far as the ideas are (considered) simply (as) modes of thought, there is no recognizable inequality among them: they all appear to come from within me in the same fashion” (AT VII 40; CSM II 27–8). Each idea is simply a mode of thought, and insofar as an idea is an existent (or actual) mode, it possesses a level of formal reality, which is that of a mode. He continues: “But in so far as different ideas (are considered as images which) represent different things, it is clear that they differ widely” (AT VII 40; CSM II 28). The differences will not only be in terms of the “objects” represented, but, as noted above, ideas will differ with respect to the levels of objective reality they contain (AT VII 40; CSM II 28).

To see how this distinction works within the context of Descartes' theory, consider an idea that has been mentioned several times already — the idea of God as introduced in the Third Meditation. Descartes' analysis of this idea begins with his focusing on the fact that the idea represents to him an infinite substance (AT VII 45; CSM II 31). The formal-objective reality distinction suggests the following. When considered simply as an existent mode of Descartes' mind, which is to consider it in terms of its formal reality, Descartes sees no trouble in accounting for the origin of the formal reality of this idea: the formal reality possessed by this idea is derived from the formal reality of his mind. But when considered as the object represented in the idea, which is to consider the idea in terms of its objective reality, Descartes discovers a problem: what is the origin of the idea's objective reality? This challenge arises in light of Descartes' saying:

Now it is manifest by the natural light that there must be at least as much (reality) in the efficient and total cause as in the effect of that cause. For where, I ask, could the effect get its reality from, if not from the cause? And how could the cause give it to the effect unless it possessed it? It follows from this both that something cannot arise from nothing, and also that what is more perfect — that is, contains in itself more reality — cannot arise from what is less perfect. And this is transparently true not only in the case of effects which possess (what the philosophers call) actual or formal reality, but also in the case of ideas, where one is considering only (what they call) objective reality. A stone, for example, which previously did not exist, cannot begin to exist unless it is produced by something which contains, either formally or eminently everything to be found in the stone; similarly, heat cannot be produced in an object which was not previously hot, except by something of at least the same order (degree or kind) of perfection as heat, and so on. But it is also true that the idea of heat, or of a stone, cannot exist in me unless it is put there by some cause which contains at least as much reality as I conceive to be in the heat or in the stone. For although this cause does not transfer any of its actual or formal reality to my idea, it should not on that account be supposed that it must be less real. The nature of an idea is such that of itself it requires no formal reality except what it derives from my thought, of which it is a mode. But in order for a given idea to contain such and such objective reality, it must surely derive it from some cause which contains at least as much formal reality as there is objective reality in the idea. For if we suppose that an idea contains something which was not in its cause, it must have got this from nothing; yet the mode of being by which a thing exists objectively (or representatively) in the intellect by way of an idea, imperfect though it may be, is certainly not nothing, and so it cannot come from nothing. (AT VII 40–1; CSM II 28–9)

The challenge in the examination of the idea of God stems from Descartes' noticing that the level of objective reality of this idea is greater than the formal reality of his own mind (AT VII 45–6; CSM II 31). The challenge, in other words, is to trace the origin of the objective reality contained in this particular idea. The level of formal reality of Descartes' mind is at best that of a finite substance. He determines this by noting that if he were an infinite substance, in this case an infinite mind, one of the things he would surely know was whether he was in fact an infinite knower (one of the things that an infinite knower would know is that it was an infinite knower). But this is something that he does not know (i.e., he does not know that he is an infinite knower). So, he is not an infinite mind, or more importantly for the argument, he is not an infinite substance (AT VII 45; CSM II 31). So, given that the cause (or origin) of the objective reality contained in this idea must possess a level of formal reality that is at least as great as the idea's level of objective reality, it follows that Descartes' mind is not (and cannot be) its origin. (This is part of Descartes' Third Meditation argument for the existence of God. For more, see the SEP entry on Descartes's epistemology.) Notice how this differs from what he says about the formal reality of an idea, namely, that his mind is the cause or origin of an idea's formal reality.

The examination of the idea of God follows almost directly upon the introduction of the possible connection between the objective reality of some of his ideas and the formal reality of extra-ideational or extra-mental objects. This suggests a more general view on what it is for certain ideas to “represent” objects, where the case of the idea of God is the model. This general view is part of Descartes' account of ideational representation, where the ideas in the account are referred to as primary ideas, of which the idea of God is the paradigm. For more on primary ideas see the next section of this entry.

3.1 Primary Ideas and a Principle of Representation

Descartes tells us that although the objective reality of an idea may have its origin in the objective reality of another idea, he claims that this cannot go on ad infinitum. “[E]ventually one must reach a primary idea, the cause of which will be like an archetype which contains formally (and in fact) all the reality (or perfection) which is present only objectively (or representatively) in the idea” (AT VII 41–2; CSM II 29, emphasis mine). And so, a primary idea is an idea whose objective reality has its origin in the formal reality of some object, which when not the mind, is some extra-mental object. It should be mentioned that some scholars have taken Descartes' causal language in this context to be part of a more general theory of occasional causation, where the presence of the formal reality of object B, set in the right sort of relation to some perceiver, is the occasion for (or the occasional cause of) the objective reality contained in idea A (See Schmaltz 2008, Nadler 2011). For the sake of interpretative neutrality on this point, in this entry the relation between the formal reality of object B and the objective reality of idea A will be cast simply in terms of origin.

Some scholars believe that in Descartes' brief discussion of primary ideas there is suggested a principle of representation (Wilson 1978, Clatterbaugh 1980, Chappell 1986, Smith 2005a, 2010a). The principle is notoriously difficult to formulate, and there is no consensus among scholars as to how it is best understood. However, a large number of scholars agree on one component of the principle, which can be expressed as a necessary (though not a sufficient) condition for representation. The necessary condition (NC) can be expressed as follows:

(NC) Idea A represents object B only if the objective reality of idea A has its origin in the formal reality of object B.

Descartes does not commit himself to taking NC as claiming that all of the objective reality in idea A must have its origin in the formal reality of object B. Rather, he seems to commit himself only to the view that if idea A represents object B, and idea A is a primary idea, then at least some of the idea's objective reality has its origin in the formal reality of object B. Even so, the origin relation is not a sufficient condition for representation. So, from the fact that the formal reality of object B is the cause (or origin) of an idea's objective reality, it will not follow that this idea represents object B.

In his analysis of this very aspect of Descartes' theory of ideas, Vere Chappell introduced the terminology of “counterparts” (Chappell 1986, 187–88). The sun as represented in my idea, which might be taken to be the “objective sun”, “would be an objective counterpart of that familiar body that exists in the sky; it [the sun in the sky], in turn, would be the actual counterpart of [the objective sun]” (ibid., 188). The sun in the sky, the actual sun, could be taken in this context to be the “formal sun”. In these terms, where the objective sun (or objective-sun) is the idea of the sun taken objectively, NC can be expressed as follows:

My idea represents the sun only if objective-sun has its origin in its counterpart, formal-sun.

This is similar to how NC is employed in the Third Meditation:

My idea represents God only if the objective reality of this idea has its origin in the formal reality of God.

Or, in Chappell's terms:

My idea represents God only if objective-God has its origin in its counterpart, formal-God.

NC is also employed in the Sixth Meditation proof for the existence of body, which can be formulated thus:

My idea represents body only if the objective reality of this idea has its origin in the formal reality of body.

There is trouble lurking for the case of the idea of the sun, which shall be addressed shortly, but for the moment it will be helpful to complete the examination of the idea of God and the idea of body. As scholars have noted, there is an important difference between the Third Meditation proof for the existence of God and the Sixth Meditation proof for the existence of body. Descartes' examination of the idea of body in the Sixth Meditation reveals that the level of objective reality possessed by this idea could easily be accounted for by an appeal to the formal reality of his own mind. That is, his mind possesses a level of formal reality sufficient to account for the presence of the level of objective reality in the idea of body. This is quite different from what we learned in the examination of the idea of God. In the Sixth Meditation proof Descartes considers several items that might serve as the origin of body as represented in his idea (i.e., he considers what might be the origin of objective-body). He considers (the formal reality of) God, his own mind, the mind of some other being (such as an angel), and body. He argues:

But since God is not a deceiver, it is quite clear that he does not transmit the idea to me either directly from himself, or indirectly, via some creature which contains the objective reality of the ideas not formally but only eminently. For God has given me no faculty at all for recognizing any such source for these ideas; on the contrary, he has given me a great propensity to believe that they are produced by corporeal things. So I do not see how God could be understood to be anything but a deceiver if the idea were transmitted from a source other than corporal things. It follows that corporeal things exist. (AT VII 79–80; CSM II 55)

One way to read this is that the veracity of God guarantees the truth of NC. Simply put, the argument is: If NC is false, then God is a deceiver. But God is not a deceiver. So, NC is true.

However, upon closer examination, when formulated in terms of other important ideas, such as the idea of the true and immutable nature of a triangle, the idea of heat, or the adventitious idea of the sun (considered earlier), NC falls prey to serious criticism. Again consider the following:

My idea represents the sun only if the objective reality of this idea has its origin in the formal reality of the sun.

Although Descartes speaks of the sun in the Third Meditation as though it were an individual body that exists independently of his mind, scholars have shown that Descartes also appears to deny that such things in fact exist as individual corporeal substances; that is, there are no bodies (plural) that are really distinct from one another (Nolan 1997, Sowaal 2004, Lennon 2007). What is argued is that Descartes holds that there are no “natural” kinds, and so there are no things such as suns, moons, flowers, tigers, and so on. The nature of a body is extension (its nature is to be extended in length, breadth, and depth). And so, there is no substantial ontological distinction to be drawn between the sun, the moon, a tiger, etc. If we draw a distinction between individual bodies, the distinction is a modal one; it will be a distinction made in terms of shapes, sizes, and so on. On this reading, there are no individuated (i.e., really distinct) corporeal substances that exist independently of the mind, but only one corporeal substance, divided modally into such “objects” as the sun, moon, etc. This was in fact what Spinoza took from his study of Descartes (Smith and Nelson 2010b). Thus, according to this interpretation, the above claim about an idea's representing the sun, cast in terms of NC, is not something that Descartes can in the end make. It would be as problematic as claiming:

My idea represents Pegasus only if the objective reality of this idea has its origin in the formal reality of Pegasus.

Clearly, Descartes would consider the idea of Pegasus to be a factitious idea, which at the very least would mean that there is no Pegasus counterpart. That is, there is no formal-Pegasus. The idea of the sun is arguably like the idea of Pegasus in that there is no formal-sun. Instead, there is simply formal-body (i.e., an actually existent corporeal substance). Reading Descartes this way opens a new proverbial can of worms, however, for the initial distinction drawn between adventitious ideas, such as the idea of the sun, and factitious ideas, such as the idea of Pegasus, is blurred. Moreover, and perhaps more importantly, what the analysis of the idea of the sun shows is that if NC expresses a principle of representation in Descartes' theory of ideas, it seems to apply only to the idea of his own (finite) mind, the idea of God, and the idea of body (for a fourth, see Nelson 2008). If this is correct, and NC applies solely to primary ideas, then these ideas (the innate ideas, or as he calls them later, the primitive notions) are the only primary ideas in Descartes' theory. (For an argument that shows how both the many bodies view and the one body view are actually compatible, see Smith 2010a.)

It would be no exaggeration to claim that the matter surrounding Descartes' view on ideational representation is among the most controversial in Descartes scholarship. In addition to those already mentioned, the controversy has given rise to at least two competing interpretations. The first is what is called a representationalist reading of Descartes' theory of ideas, and is the reading this entry has considered thus far. It is a long-standing reading of Descartes. The second is what is called a direct realist reading of Descartes' theory of ideas. This second interpretation is based on a distinction that Descartes introduced in the Preface To The Reader of the Meditations, the material-objective distinction, which will be discussed next.

3.2 Ideas and The Material-Objective Distinction

There is a second distinction that Descartes introduces, the material-objective distinction. Some scholars have argued that it is importantly different from the distinction considered earlier, the formal-objective reality distinction (Smith 2005a, 2005b, 2010a). Even so, on their surface they appear no different, which has led some scholars to claim that they are in fact one and the same (Grene 1986, Nadler 1989). This second distinction is not clearly formulated in the body of the Meditations, though Descartes finds himself relying on it, for instance, in his reply to Antione Arnauld (1612–1694), author of the Fourth Set of Objections, though what he says is confusing — a confusion that has received much attention from scholars. (See, for example, Kenny 1968, Wilson 1978, Wells 1984, Normore 1986, Smith 2005a, 2005b, 2010a, Wee 2007, De Rosa 2010.) In fact, this second distinction is not “officially” introduced in the Meditations until Descartes writes the book's Preface To The Reader, which was very likely written after the Meditations and the texts now referred to as the “Objections and Replies”. In the Preface, Descartes notes an ambiguity in the word “idea”. He says:

‘Idea’ can be taken materially, as an operation of the intellect, in which case it cannot be said to be more perfect than me. Alternatively, it can be taken objectively, as the thing represented by that operation; and this thing, even if it is not regarded as existing outside the intellect, can still, in virtue of its essence, be more perfect than myself. (AT VII 8; CSM II 7)

Descartes tells us that there are two ways to take or to conceive an idea. The first is to take an idea as an act or operation of the mind. In this sense, the idea is simply an actual or existent mode or modification of the mind, and insofar as it is, its formal reality is derived from the formal reality of the mind. And given that an effect cannot possess more reality than its cause, it follows that its “level” of formal reality cannot be greater than that of the mind. This is what Descartes means when claiming that his ideas, understood as modes or as acts of the mind, cannot be “more perfect” than his mind. When taking an idea in this sense, Descartes says that we take the idea materially. Secondly, we can take an idea as that which is represented to the mind by way of this act or operation. Here, we would be taking or conceiving the idea in terms of its representational aspect. To take an idea in this sense, as he says in the above passage, is to take the idea objectively. As just noted, on its surface the material-objective distinction looks to be simply an alternate formulation of the formal-objective reality distinction. But, understanding them as being different actually suggests a way of settling the conflict between the representationalist and direct realist readings of Descartes' theory of ideas. This is worth a brief look. First, then, it will be shown how the two distinctions differ, which will be followed (in the next section of this entry) by an extended though brief discussion of these two competing interpretations.

3.3 A Distinction Between Distinctions

When an idea is taken as a mode of mind, we take the idea in terms of its formal being or reality, and so take it, as Descartes will say, formally. And as we also know, when an idea is taken as an act or operation of the intellect, we take the idea materially. Now, given that to take an idea as an act or operation is to take it as a mode, it would seem that formal and material are synonymous. And, as noted earlier, scholars have made this very argument (Grene 1986, Nadler 1989). But, there is a way of understanding the distinctions that shows that they are different, which in turn shows that the terms formally and materially are not synonymous.

Recall the formal-objective reality distinction. When applied to primary ideas, the distinction traces out the two kinds of reality possessed by an idea. Taking the idea formally, the distinction traces out the formal reality of the idea to the formal reality of the mind, of which it is a mode. Taking the idea objectively, the distinction traces out the objective reality of the idea ultimately to the formal reality of some object, which, when not the mind, is some object that exists external to, or independently of, the mind. This distinction, then, emphasizes two relations: the relation that the idea has (as mode) to the mind, and the relation that the idea has (as representer) to the object it represents.

Now recall the material-objective distinction. Taking the idea materially, the distinction takes the idea as an act or operation of the intellect. Presumably, the act or operation is the act of representation. Taking the idea objectively, the distinction takes the idea as the object as represented by way of this act or operation. No doubt this is coextensive with objectively in the formal-objective reality distinction. Here is what is important: unlike the formal-objective reality distinction, the material-objective distinction emphasizes only one relation: the relation between the idea as act and the idea (the very same idea) as the object presented or exhibited to the mind by way of this act. In other words, the material-objective distinction brings to light the internal relation between the idea as act of representation and the idea as representational content, a relation that is in fact not recognized in the formal-objective reality distinction.

This analysis of the two distinctions suggests the following:

Consider again the idea of God. In light of the formal-objective reality distinction, the “features” of this idea can be analyzed into two categories:

(1) Features whose origin is (solely) the mind,
and,
(2) Features whose origin is the mind and God.

Those features falling under (1) are formal features. They are simply those features derived from the mind, of which the idea is a mode. Thus, the idea's formal reality is a feature falling under (1). By contrast, those features falling under (2) are objective features. They are those features that link the idea's representational content to God. Even so, the mind is included among the origin of such features, since Descartes will tell us that the objects as represented, that is, the objective beings, will not exist “outside the intellect” (AT VII 8; CSM II 7). So, insofar as God as represented, that is, objective-God, is an entity that does not exist external to, or independently of, the mind, its being must have some dependence on the mind. For lack of better names, call (1)-type features “non-representational features” and (2)-type features “representational features”.

The material-objective distinction specifically allows for a further analysis of representational features. For example, taken materially the idea of God is taken as an act or operation of the mind. And, insofar as this operation plays a part in producing the object presented or exhibited, the objective being — objective-God in the case now being considered — depends in some important sense on the mind (this says nothing more than that mental objects depend in some sense on the mind). Even so, insofar as the object presented or exhibited is God, and not some other object, the object presented or exhibited depends on something other than this operation. It depends on something in God. This, in fact, is precisely what NC claimed. So, representational features can be analyzed thus:

(2a) Features regarded in terms of the representational operation,

and,

(2b) Features regarded in terms of God.

These are two ways of regarding representational features. Considering the idea in terms of that by way of which God is presented or exhibited to (or in) the mind, we understand the representational feature in terms of (2a). Here, we take the idea as an operation of representation. This is to take the idea materially. By contrast, considering the idea in terms of God, that is, in terms of the object it represents, we understand the representational feature in terms of (2b). This is to take the idea objectively. If this is correct, then taking or regarding an idea formally is identified with category (1), whereas taking or regarding an idea materially is identified with category (2a). Since (1) and (2a) are not identical categories, formally and materially are not synonymous.

4. Representationalist and Direct Realist Readings Reconsidered

As noted earlier, the representationalist reading of Descartes' theory of ideas is a long-standing reading in the secondary literature. Relatively recently scholars have introduced a possible alternative reading, which is called the direct realist reading. Steven Nadler, for example, has located this interpretation in Arnauld, a contemporary of Descartes' (as noted earlier, Arnauld is the author of the Fourth Set of Objections).

As the name suggests, the representationalist reading takes ideas as principally representations of things. According to some versions of the theory, an idea is referred to as a tertium quid, that is, as a third thing. Such a “thing” serves as a sort of bridge between the mind and the world that exists external to, or independently of, the mind. Understood this way, ideas form what scholars have referred to as a “veil of perception.” Ideas are the direct “objects” of perception, whereas it is via our ideas that we only indirectly perceive extra-mental objects (assuming such exist) (Kenny 1968, Wilson 1978, Chappell 1986). (The “veil of perception” phrasing has its origin in Bennett 1971.)

The direct realist reading rejects the notion of a veil of perception (Yolton 1984, Nadler 1989). On this reading, in cases of perceiving extra-mental objects, where such perceptions are veridical, the objects that are directly perceived are in fact the objects that exist external to, or independently of, the mind. There is no “third thing” that stands between the mind and external or extra-mental objects.

As noted earlier, the direct realist reading has its roots in a certain interpretation of the material-objective distinction. Recall that when applied to an analysis of ideas, this distinction tells us the following: when taken materially, we take an idea as an act or operation of representation. By contrast, when we take this very same idea objectively, we take the idea in terms of its representational content, which belongs to (and is generated by) this act or operation. According to Nadler's account of direct realism, Descartes' view is that all ideas are ultimately to be understood as act-ideas (Nadler 1989). Ideas in this context are said to be “directed at” their objects. So, in the case of the sensory idea of the sun, the idea can be understood to be directed at the sun, that is, at the sun itself, the object in the heavens. In taking the idea as act in this context, it is taken materially. But every act-idea also possesses representational content (Nadler 1989). When considered as such, the idea is taken objectively. The point to stress is that the mind is directed at the sun, at the extra-mental object, and not at the content of the idea.

One interesting feature of this reading is that what determines the idea's content is not necessarily the extra-mental object at which the mind is directed (Nadler 1989, 127–28). In other words, the idea's content is not necessarily related to the object at which the mind is directed. And so, in the case where an act-idea is directed at the sun, for instance, the idea's content is not necessarily “of” the sun, but could in fact exhibit to the mind some other object, such as the moon, which might occur in a case of hallucinating. Likewise, an act-idea might be directed at certain motions in the brain (in which case the act-idea is not directed at the sun), but the idea's content nevertheless exhibits to the mind the sun. This might occur in a case of recollecting the sun. But if this is correct, what determines what an idea is “of”? Is an idea “of” the sun insofar as the sun is the object at which the act-idea is directed, or is the idea “of” the sun insofar as the sun is the object exhibited in the idea's content? It is not clear how this reading of Descartes can answer these questions.

There is another version of the direct realist reading, this one based primarily on a distinction found in Aquinas, which attempts to resolve the above mentioned sort of difficulty (Hoffman 2002). Here, the theory tells us that objects such as the sun itself are what possess the two distinct kinds of reality, formal and objective reality. Insofar as the sun possesses formal reality, it is a thing that exists independently of the mind. This is the sun that exists in the heavens. Insofar as this same object, the sun, possesses objective reality, it is that which the mind is aware of when perceiving the sun. There is an underlying identity between formal-sun and objective-sun. “The sun as it exists objectively is able to represent the sun as it exists formally in the heavens precisely because it is the same thing that has these two different modes of existence” (Hoffman 202, p, 168). Objective and formal reality are simply two different aspects of one and the same object, the sun. They are two different ways in which the sun exists. Thus when one perceives the objective sun, one perceives the sun itself (or, rather, one aspect of it). In this way, when one perceives the sun, and objective-sun is identical to the sun itself (it is simply one way of being the sun), the sun is directly perceived.

There are troubles lurking for these interpretations. To help bring some of the troubles to light, consider the following analogy: the analogy of Socrates standing before a mirror. The analogy will hold for what were earlier called primary ideas.

Socrates and the mirror exist independently of one another. Yet both are necessary for the image of Socrates (located on the mirror's surface). Destroy either Socrates or the mirror, and we destroy the image of Socrates. It is easy to locate the various elements of Descartes' theory of ideas in this analogy. To begin, let the image of Socrates be analogue to an idea. It is that which represents Socrates. When considering this image objectively, then, we take it in terms of what it is “of” or in terms of that which it represents, which is Socrates. When considering this image materially, however, we take it in terms of the operation of representation, which in this case would be something like the shiny surface of the mirror. For, it is by way of this shiny surface that the mirror is able to represent Socrates. According to the representationalist reading, the bearer of the image, the mirror, looks to be analogue to the mind. Lastly, Socrates, who stands before the mirror, is analogue to an extra mental object.

According to Descartes' ontology, both Socrates and the mirror, in being existent things, will possess some level of formal reality (in this case, the level will be that of a finite substance). Recall that according to the representationalist reading, Descartes is committed to the view that Socrates and the image on the mirror are importantly related. The image (its objective reality) is importantly related to the formal reality of Socrates. Thus, if Socrates does not stand before the mirror, the image will not be (and cannot be) “of” Socrates. (This is what NC would claim: The idea represents Socrates only if objective-Socrates has its origin in its counterpart, formal-Socrates.) The troubles associated with this reading have been discussed. So, only troubles associated with the two direct realist readings will be considered in what remains.

According to the first direct realist reading (Nadler's), the tie between the objective reality of an idea and the formal reality of anything external to, or independently of, the mind is not necessary. That is, the external object at which the mind is directed need not play any role in determining the representational content of an act-idea. Rather, the act-idea is solely responsible for determining such content. Thinking now in terms of the analogy, this would be like saying that whatever stands before the mirror need not play any role in determining what the image is “of.” Instead, what determines what the image is of is the shiny surface of the mirror (here, analogue to taking the act-idea materially). This implies, then, that there can be mirror images of Socrates even though Socrates is not standing in front of the mirror. This is no doubt a problem for this reading. What about the second direct realist reading (Hoffman's)? It, recall, locates the idea (taken objectively) on such objects as the sun. In light of the analogy, this would be analogous to locating the image on Socrates (as opposed to locating it on the mirror). This implies that there can be mirror images of Socrates even though there were no mirrors. This is a problem lurking for this reading.

It should be clear that Descartes' theory of ideas has been, and continues to be, a difficult theory to pin down. Much of the literature following in Descartes' wake, beginning with his contemporaries, has been dedicated to providing interpretations of the theory. And, this history includes a list of significant and serious critics, including Arnauld, Malebranche, Leibniz, Spinoza, Locke, Berkeley, Hume, and Kant. It would not be an exaggeration to say that Descartes' theory of ideas, whether directly or indirectly, has helped to frame modern Western philosophy as it emerged from the seventeenth century.

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Other Internet Resources

Acknowledgments

I thank Alan Nelson for helpful comments on earlier drafts of this entry, and I thank Andrew Pessin for his original entry on this material, which helped set the stage for this one.

Copyright © 2013 by
Kurt Smith <ksmit4@bloomu.edu>

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