Determinates vs. Determinables

First published Fri Apr 26, 2002; substantive revision Tue Feb 22, 2011

Everything red is colored, and all squares are polygons. A square is distinguished from other polygons by being four-sided, equilateral, and equiangular. What distinguishes red things from other colored things? This has been understood as a conceptual rather than scientific question. Theories of wavelengths and reflectance and sensory processing are not considered. Given just our ordinary understanding of color, it seems that what differentiates red from other colors is only redness itself. The Cambridge logician W. E. Johnson introduced the terms determinate and determinable to apply to examples such as red and colored. Chapter XI, of Johnson's Logic, Part I (1921), “The Determinate and the Determinable,” is the main text for discussion of this distinction.

This entry consists of the following sections. Section 1 attends closely to Chapter XI, of W. E. Johnson's Logic, Part I. Section 2 briefly discusses Johnson's use of the determinate-determinable relation elsewhere than Chapter XI of Logic, Part I, and connects this with A. N. Prior, “Determinables, Determinates, and Determinants” (1949). Section 3 describes a 1959 symposium between Stephan Körner and John Searle entitled “On Determinables and Resemblance” and examines both contributions critically. Section 4 describes the Munsell Color Solid so that color examples can be more exact. Section 5 describes and criticizes attempts to define the determinate-determinable relation by means of predicate entailment in the style of Searle. Section 6 pays more attention to this distinction and directs attention to a certain understanding of “disjunctive predicate.” Contrived disjunctive and conjunctive predicates are the typical cause of difficulties in attempts to define the determinate-determinable relation. Section 7 distinguishes independent predicates from non-independent predicates, and thus distinguishes disjunctive and conjunctive predicates from non-disjunctive and non-conjunctive predicates, in a way that assumes no prior classifications of determinates under a determinable. Section 8 explores a view advanced by Johnson and endorsed by many others that the things in the world, as distinguished from our descriptions and conceptions of them, are absolutely determinate. This section entertains the contrary view that nothing is absolutely determinate.


1. W. E. Johnson's Chapter on The Determinable

1.1 Substantive and Adjective

Johnson invents phrases and also attaches new meanings to familiar words. His terms determinate, determinable, occurrent, continuant and ostensive definition have entered the philosophical lexicon. Some of his innovations are largely forgotten. Throughout Logic and especially throughout Part I, Chapter XI, Johnson uses a distinction between substantive and adjective. Although he draws and observes many distinctions meticulously, the distinction between the mention of a linguistic expression and its use is not among them. Adjective and substantive sometimes appear in his writings to be linguistic items. More often they are definitely non-linguistic. They are logical categories, “the ultimate comprising classes” (1922, p. 60). “My distinction between substantive and adjective is roughly equivalent to the more popular philosophical antithesis between particular and universal; the notions, however, do not exactly coincide” (1922, p. xiii). The term ‘adjective’ remains in all forthcoming quotations from Johnson. In discussion of Johnson, the term ‘property’ often replaces ‘adjective’ although it is not an exact equivalent.

Johnson is interested in the logical differences between ‘Red is a colour’ and ‘Plato is a man’. He says that the second sentence involves adjectival predication. ‘Human’ is an adjective (property) predicated of Plato. ‘Colour,’ on the other hand, is not an adjective (property) predicated of red (1921, p. 176).

1.2 Similarity and Difference

Johnson begins his discussion of determinables by contrasting them with classes.

The relation of a determinate to its determinable resembles that of an individual to a class, but differs in some important respects. For instance, taking any given determinate, there is only one determinable to which it can belong. Moreover, any one determinable is a literal summum genus not subsumable under any higher genus; and the absolute determinate is a literal infima species under which no other determinate is subsumable. (Part I, Introduction, 1921, p. xxxv)

Johnson's claim here about “only one determinable” is strictly speaking inconsistent with what he says later about degrees of determination. Using color, one of Johnson's central examples, we say that red and blue are determinate with respect to the determinable color, and Carolina Blue and Duke Blue are determinate with respect to the determinable blue. Johnson means to claim here that there is one ultimate or highest determinable to which Carolina Blue can belong. Plato, in contrast, belongs to many classes. Even if it is unclear to which ultimate classes Plato belongs, there is no reason to insist that there is only one ultimate class to which he belongs.

What makes red and blue and Carolina Blue all colors? Johnson denies that there is some property [some “secondary” adjective] that red and blue share that makes them both colors. The view that color is itself a property that red and blue share requires an explanation of what distinguishes the color red from the color blue. Explanations such as “Red is the color of fire trucks” and “Blue is the color of my true love's eyes” miss the point. They refer to mere contingent facts. An appropriate explanation should provide a necessary truth such as ‘Triangles are three-sided polygons.’

Rather than resemblance, the sharing of some property, that make red and blue colors, says Johnson, it is differences between colors.

In fact, the several colours are put into the same group and given the same name colour, not on the ground of any partial agreement, but on the ground of the special kind of difference which distinguishes one colour from another; whereas no such difference exists between a colour and a shape. (1921, p. 176)

The absence of a difference or exclusion of this kind explains why red and square are not determinates of a single determinable. “Taking any given determinate, there is only one determinable to which it can belong” (1921, p. xxxv). The nature of the exclusion also explains why no two determinates of the same determinable can qualify exactly the same entire spatio-temporal part of any object (1921, p. 181).

Arguments about the incompatibility of colors in the 1950s and 1960s were concerned with theories of necessity, analyticity, the a priori, and meaning. (Edwards and Pap, 1973, has a bibliography of such works, pp. 745–746.) Sanford (1966) surveys some of the disagreements about how best to describe this incompatibility. He advocates characterizing incompatibility by means of indistinguishability. “Red and green are completely different colors” means “Nothing is indistinguishable in color both from something red and (at the same time) from something green” (p. 357). Unlike many discussions of this issue, his refers explicitly to the notion of a determinate. He asserts that the conviction that red and green are completely different “is just a specific case of the general conviction that the characteristics of things are absolutely determinate”(p. 358). He offers no argument to support this implausible claim. Sanford ignores the point that if his claim were true, Johnson's attempt to explain the determinate-determinable relation by means of incompatiblity would be circular.

There are gradual transitions from one hue to another. For any two distinguishable hues, there is a third more similar in hue to each of them than they are similar to each other. Some philosophers take this as an important feature in explaining the incompatibility of colors. See, for example, Wittgenstein (1929) and Putnam (1956). Pitch provides another example of of gradual transitions. For any sounds that are distinguishable in pitch, there is a third sound more similar to pitch to each of them than they are similar to each other.

Suppositions that things might be otherwise require no great efforts of imagination. Suppose that human perception of hue were coarse-grained and digital: humans distinguish red, orange, yellow, green, blue, violet, and purple, and no intermediate hues. (They might still perceive gradual transitions of saturation and brightness.) Different versions of this fantasy specify differently just what happens at the transition from the appearance of one hue to the appearance of another. Suppositions of discrete hue transitions are not obviously relevant to the problems of accounting for the incompatibility of distinguishable hues.

Human perception of hue and pitch are unlike in important respects. Mixtures of pitches do not perceptually overwhelm their components. When the component pitches of these mixtures have certain relations to each other, they are chords. Some listeners hear a chord as an undifferentiated sound. Others, especially those with training (like Johnson, an accomplished pianist) easily hear the component pitches. Whether or not one is able to hear its component pitches, a chord is not, and does not sound like, a pitch intermediate between its components.

Mixing hues obliterates them. Something orange may be both reddish and yellowish, but red and yellow to not compose orange in the way two pitches compose a perfect fifth. The composition of orange by mixing red and yellow is subtractive. Mixing of this kind is familiar from combining paints or dyes and also from passing light through filters. In additive mixing, as when a surface reflects lights of different colors, there is also no “chord” of light. Some results surprise people with little experience of additive mixture, as when a mixture of red and green is indistinguishable from monochromatic yellow light. The components red and green are definitely not perceptible in the mixture. It is common knowledge that white decomposes into its component hues. Composition of these hues in turn, another example of additive mixing, produces white light. Our incapacity to distinguish the individual components of white and of other color mixtures is our incapacity. It is due not to purely physical properties of electromagnetic energy of certain wavelengths but to our mechanisms of color vision.

Johnson says that pitches are determinates. In what sense are two pitches incompatible? What is the pitch-analogue of “No two things can be rted and green all over at the same time?” The following purported analogues are obviously false: no piano can produce middle C and the A above middle C at the same time; no room can be filled with middle C and the A above middle C at the same time.

Other sensory qualities diverge still further from the color-incompatibility paradigms. It is just untrue that nothing can be sweet and sour at the same time. We can mix sweet and sour tastes, as in making lemonade with different proportions of sugar and lemon juice, to produce a taste that is somewhat analogous to a pitch chord. Despite this analogy, however, there is also a disanalogy between pitch and taste. While pitch mixing does not produce intermediate pitches, there are other means to produce them. (For example, depress a key between the C and A keys.) It is not obvious that there are analogous pure tastes intermediate between sweet and sour that differ from mixtures of the two tastes.

As a sensory quality, and even more as a quality in general, color is anomalous. Philosophers nevertheless frequently use color as their paradigm example. Following tradition and Johnson, this entry relies mainly on color examples to present and then to resolve a difficulty for an approach to characterizing the determinate-determinable relation. As the last few paragraphs suggest, however, it is difficult to generalize the incompatibility of color to provide a general account of this relation. It seems to be an open question what makes different tastes and different pitches determinates of their respective determinables.

1.3 Determinables and Genera

Treatments of the determinate-determinable relation often contrast it with the species-genus relation. Features such as three-sided differentiate the species triangle under the genus polygon, while the only feature that distinguishes the determinate red under the determinable color is the very determinate itself. A genus-species relation obtains when a proper definition of the form X = YZ is possible. When no such definition is possible and certain other formal requirements are satisfied, the determinable-determinate relation obtains. For this neat, sharp contrast, Johnson provides at best only equivocal support. His remarks are sometimes incompatible with this contrast.

Consider Johnson's examples. The introduction of the term ‘determinable’ in Chapter XI reads: “I propose to call such terms as colour and shape determinables in relation to such terms as red and circular which will be called determinates” (1921, p. 174). So circular is a determinate of the determinable shape despite the existence of a proper definition that distinguishes circles from other shapes. Different shapes are incompatible and are therefore under the same determinable. Being related by incompatibility (in the right way) appears to be necessary and sufficient for items to be determinates under a single determinable. Some determinates such as red cannot be differentiated by a traditional, conjunctive genus-species definition. Others such as square and circular can be so differentiated. Johnson's example of shape shows that a determinable-determinate relation does not require the impossibility of a conjunctive definition.

Rather than insist on a sharp contrast, Johnson attempts to subsume traditional species-genus relations under determinate-determinable relations:

We have now to point out that the increased determination of adjectival predication which leads to a narrowing of extension may consist—not in a process of conjunction of separate adjectives—but in the process of passing from a comparatively indeterminate adjective to a comparatively more determinate adjective under the same determinable. Thus there is a genuine difference between that process of increased determination which conjunctivally introduces foreign adjectives, and that other process by which without increasing, so to speak, the number of adjectives, we define them more determinately.

In fact, the foreign adjective which appears to be added on in the conjunctive process, is really not introduced from the outside, but is itself a determinate under another determinable, present from the start, though suppressed in the explicit connotation of the genus. (Johnson, 1921, pp. 178–9)

Johnson goes on to provide a symbolic representation of botanical classification in which there are five determinables. One of these determinables is number of cotyledons under which fall the determinates acotyledon, monocotyledon, and dicotyledon. The other determinables concern stamens, the corolla, forms of attachment, and divisibility. The determinables in this botanical example represent “the summum genus ‘plants’ as describable under these five heads” (1921, p. 180). A determinable can have several dimensions.

Johnson's discussion of color variations illustrates such dimensions. Colors vary according to hue, saturation and brightness, and these variations are independent of one another. If hue, saturation, and brightness are determinables, they are not separate, since they depend on each other. There cannot be saturation without hue, for example, even though no determination of saturation requires any particular determination of hue. Johnson says that the determinable color is “single, though complex, in the sense that the several constituent characters upon whose variations its variability depends are inseparable” (1921, p. 183).

There is a difficulty here because the dependence patterns between the three variables are not entirely uniform. Hue and saturation cannot exist without each other, or without brightness, but degrees of brightness do not require either hue or saturation. Black and white movies and photographs and many other achromatic examples come to mind. Dimensions of quality space can vary in their dependence relations on each other.

1.4 Quality Order

There are differences between determinates under the same determinable. Johnson says these differences are comparable. The difference between red and yellow, for example, is greater than that between red and orange.

In this case the several determinates are to be conceived as necessarily assuming a certain serial order, which develops from the idea of what may be called ‘adjectival betweenness.’ The term ‘between’ is used here in a familiar metaphorical sense imagined most naturally in spatial form. (1921, pp. 181–182)

The three-place relation (Dabc) the difference between a and c is greater than that between a and b, however, does not by itself provide an adequate definition of ‘between.’ A diagram helps to illustrate this point. Assume for the purpose of diagramming that the difference between a and c specifies a certain distance in quality space. A circle with center a and radius ac represents points in the space at distance ac from point a. Any distance between point a and any point b within this circle is less than the distance between a and c. A point b within this circle represents Dabc. As Figure 1 illustrates, Dabc is consistent with the distance between b and c being greater than the distance between a and c. For further treatment of this topic, see the Supplement on Quality Order.

figure 1
Figure 1

Johnson uses his notion of betweenness to draw two independent distinctions between quality order, interminable series in contrast with cyclic, and continuous series in contrast with discrete (1921, pp. 182–183). His use of the three-place relation the difference between a and c is greater than that between a and b undermines a point he insists on earlier that resemblance between determinates does not group them under a determinable. Johnson's three-place relation can also be expressed the similarity between a and b is greater than that between a and c. Comparisons between differences are also comparisons between likenesses or similarities. Perhaps his point can be expressed as follows: no two-place relation of resemblance groups determinates under a determinable, although a three-place relation can be useful for this purpose. Johnson's chapter ends with the pronouncement that “The practical impossibility of literally determinate characterization must be contrasted with the universally adopted postulate that the characters of things which we can only characterize more or less indeterminately, are, in actual fact, absolutely determinate” (1921, p.185). Section 8 examines this claim.

2. W. E. Johnson and A. N. Prior

Johnson discuses determinates and determinables in Parts II and III of Logic (1922, 1924) and also elsewhere in Part I. In Part I, in a chapter entitled “Laws of Thought,” Johnson formulates four principles of adjectival determination that correspond to four more familiar principles of propositional determinations such as ‘Not both P and not-P’ and ‘Either P or not-P.’

In Part III, Johnson is concerned primarily with induction and causation. Throughout Part III, he distinguishes the ‘occurrent’ from the ‘continuant’ and often discusses change, cause, and continuants with reference to determinates of determinables.

In Part II, Johnson refers to determinables in several different contexts. One discussion is especially important for understanding Prior's later treatment of the topic. Johnson introduces the notion of a structural proposition which he compares to “what Kant meant by ‘analytic’” (1922, pp. 14–15). In a structural proposition, “it is impossible to realise the meaning of the subject-term without implicitly conceiving it under that category” (1922, p. 15).

Arthur N. Prior takes up the question of structural propositions that relate determinates to determinables in the two-part article “Determinables, Determinates, and Determinants” (Prior, 1949).

Since a subject's being in a certain universe or category, i.e., its being determinable in certain ways, is presupposed in every genuine characterization of it, an assertion that it is in this category, and is thus determinable, would have for its predicate something which cannot really be separated from the subject in order to be predicated of it. (Prior, 1949, p. 18)

Prior's article reveals his very wide-ranging knowledge of the history of logic. The article together with Prior (1955), reflects a detailed knowledge of Johnson's entire logical system, not only the three-part Logic (1921, 1922, 1924), but also Johnson (1892). Although some of the topics in Prior (1949) have not prompted much subsequent discussion in connection with determinates and determinables, Prior puts his finger on one theme that is now central.

The problem of fitting the relation between determinates and determinables into a purely “conjunctional” logic might be summarily described as the problem of justifying the inference from “This is red” to “This is coloured” on the assumption that all formal inference consists in the passage from a conjunction to one of its conjuncts. (Prior, 1949, pp. 191–192)

As mentioned earlier, there seems to be no conjunction of the proper kind of the form ‘x is F and x is colored’ that is equivalent to ‘x is red.’ Examples of improper conjunctions are:

x is red and x is colored,
x is either red or not colored, and x is colored.

3. The Körner-Searle Symposium

The 1959 Joint Session of the Aristotelian Society and the Mind Association included a symposium “On Determinables and Resemblance” in which Stephan Körner spoke first and John Searle spoke second.

Körner presents a logic of inexact concepts which reappears in his 1966 book Experience and Theory. This logic recognizes, in addition to traditional set members and non-members, intermediate or neutral set members. Two overlapping sets are related by exclusion-overlap if, by stipulating of each neutral candidate that it is either positive or negative, it is possible to end up with two overlapping sets and it is possible to end up with two sets related by exclusion (Körner, 1966, pp. 45–46. This clarifies or revises Körner, 1959, pp. 127–128). He gives blue and green as examples to illustrate exclusion overlap. Blue and green (strictly, the set of blue things and the set of green things) are not absolutely exact; they have neutral candidates. Since nothing is a member of the green set and also a member of the blue set, these sets exclude each other. When each neutral candidate is converted by stipulation either to a member or to a non-member, the two adjusted sets may still exclude each other, because no neutral candidate has been designated both green and blue, or if there is at least one formerly neutral candidate that is now both green and blue, the adjusted sets overlap.

Körner claims that determinates under the same determinable are linked, directly or indirectly, by exclusion-overlap. Red and green are not directly related by exclusion overlap, but they are presumably related indirectly by direct links between red and orange, orange and yellow, yellow and yellowish green, yellowish green and green. The concepts of red and green are therefore linked. Concepts are linked if and only if they are related by exclusion overlap or the ancestral of exclusion overlap (1959. pp. 130–131). Concepts P and Q are fully linked if and only if every species of P is linked with every species of Q (1959, p. 131). Full linkage is crucial to Körner's treatment of determinates and determinables.

Körner attempts to explain the determinate-determinable relation by means of full linkage. He asserts that full linkage is a stronger relation than mere linkage. It is difficult, however, to be convinced that this is true. If at least one species of P is linked to at least one species of Q, and all the species of P are linked to each other, as are all the species of Q, then every species of P is linked with every species of Q, and P and Q are fully linked. Körner claims that ‘angry,’ a species of ‘yellow or angry,’ is not linked with ‘green.’ This would be an interesting and important result, if true. Körner here identifies a problem that occupies subsequent discussions. How are we to distinguish ordinary predicates such as ‘green’ from disjunctive predicates such as ‘yellow or angry’?

It appears that on Körner's own definitions, ‘green’ and ‘yellow’ are linked, ‘yellow’ is linked to ‘yellow or angry,’ and ‘yellow or angry’ is linked to ‘angry,’ so ‘green’ is linked to ‘angry.’ Until explanations are forthcoming how one or more of these alleged linkages violate Körner's requirements, the main influence of his contribution is to direct attention to the problem of disjunctive predicates.

John Searle makes a fresh start. In his attempt to explicate the determinate-determinable relation, he uses the notion of predicate entailment. In the standard sense, entailment is a relation between items, such as propositions, that have truth-values. Searle extends this notion to a relation between predicates. ‘Red’ entails ‘colored’ because it is impossible for something to be red and not colored. This is a natural extension, and others have adopted it. Indeed, talk of predicate entailment leads easily to talk of property entailment: the property red entails the property colored.

Searle and others who follow him draw a sharp distinction between the determinate-determinable relation and the genus-species relation. (He repeats this distinction in Searle, 1967.) The definition of a species is by means of genus and differentia, which are logically independent. (Predicates F and G are independent when none of the following entailments hold: F entails G, G entails F, F entails not-G, and not-F entails G.) A determinate of a determinable cannot be defined in this way, by a conjunction of independent predicates. A traditional (although inadequate) definition ‘Man is a rational animal’ passes the genus/differentia test. ‘Rational’ and ‘animal’ are independent terms. The attempted definition ‘Red is a color that is red’ does not pass because ‘red’ entails ‘colored.’

There are both historical and logical difficulties with this view.

The genus-species relation is an ancient philosophical topic. No crisp, clear definition can be consistent with everything that has been said before. Searle's confident exposition, however, contradicts some standard views. A logic text in wide use for many decades gives the following as a rule of definition:

The better the definition, the more completely will the differentia be something that can only be conceived as a modification of the genus: and the less appropriately therefore will it be called a mere attribute of the subject defined. (Joseph, 1916, p. 112)

Aristotle mentions differentia that entail the genus, as in ‘Walking animal’ (Topics, IV. 6) and ‘Footed animal’ (Metaphysics, Z. 12). In his Commentary on Z. 12, Bostock says that the first differentia should entail the genus (Aristotle, 1994, pp. 176–184). Other philosophers have adopted Searle's proposal, so it is evidently attractive. It does not represent a consensus of earlier writers.

The nature of conjunction poses a logical problem for Searle's account of species. If two conjunctions are logically equivalent, it does not follow that the conjuncts of one are logically equivalent to the conjuncts of the other. The forthcoming example concerns conjunctive propositional functions about pure numbers. It is easy to construct parallel examples about mass, length, temperature, years of service, taxable income, and so on.

Ax: x is greater than 4 but less than 7
Bx: x is greater than 4 but less than 6.
Cx: x is greater than 5 but less than 7.
Dx: x is less than 6.
Ex: x is greater than 5.
Fx: Bx & Cx.
Gx: Dx & Ex.
Hx: Bx & Ex.
Ix: Cx & Dx.

The last four predicates, Fx, Gx, Hx, and Ix, are equivalent, so they entail the same predicates and are entailed by the same predicates. They all entail Ax, and Ax entails none of them. Their conjuncts, by design, have various entailment relations. Both conjuncts of Fx entail Ax. Neither conjunct of Gx entails Ax. One conjunct of Hx and of Ix entails Ax and the other conjunct in each case does not.

Searle says that “a species is a conjunction of two logically independent properties—the genus and the differentia” (1959, p. 143). Does he mean (a) that every conjunction equivalent to the species satisfies this requirement or (b) that at least one conjunction satisfies the requirement? Stipulation (a) is too difficult to satisfy, for any species is equivalent to the conjunction of itself and the genus. Stipulation (b) is too easy to satisfy, as will be shown next. The following predicates continue the numerical example above:

Jx: x is greater than 5 but less than 6.
Kx: Jx or (x is greater than 2 but less than 3).
Lx: Ax & Kx.

Jx and Lx are equivalent to each other and also to Fx, Gx, Hx, and Ix. If we consider Ax to be the genus, then Lx is a conjunction of the genus and a term Kx logically independent of the genus. One can perform a trick of the same kind with the standard example of color. Consider the following contrived ‘genus and differentia’ definition of red as a species of the genus colored:

x is red =df (x is colored) & (x is red or x is not colored).

Searle's distinction between genus-species and determinate-determinable requires some principled way of excluded disjunctive predicates such as ‘Kx’ and ‘x is red or x is not colored.’ Explaining the determinate/determinable relation requires this anyway, whether or not accepts Searle's views about the relation of species to genus.

Searle attempts to define the determinate-determinable relation and to eliminate hybrid, cross-type conjunctive and disjunctive predicates by using only the relation of predicate entailment. When a predicate A entails a predicate B, but B does not entail A, Searle says that A specifies B (1959, p. 145). A is a non-conjunctive specifier of B if and only if A specifies B and there is no pair of terms C and D such that A is equivalent to (entails and is entailed by) the conjunction of C and D, C specifies B, D does not entail B, and not-D does not entail B. Take the letters A, B, C, and D as abbreviations for some new predicates:

A: red
B: colored
C: colored but not green
D: red or (not colored and not prime)

A specifies B. There are terms C and D such that A is equivalent to (C & D), C specifies B, D does not specify B, and not-D does not specify B. So according to this definition, red is not a non-conjunctive specifier of colored, a result that is opposite to what Searle intends. He says that a necessary condition of As being a determinate of B is that A is a non-conjunctive specifier of B. Like everyone who addresses this topic, Searle takes the relation between red and colored to be a paradigm of the determinate-determinable relation.

Searle adds another condition with the intention of excluding disjunctive predicates such as ‘yellow or angry.’ A determinate of a determinable must not only be a non-conjunctive specifier of the determinable, it must be logically related to all other non-conjunctive specifiers of the determinable. Suppose that the definition of ‘non-conjunctive specifier’ can be emended somehow to allow red as a non-conjunctive specifier of colored. The new requirement of logical independence wrecks the project once again because it eliminates colored as a determinable. Consider darkish red to darkish orange. Darkish red to darkish orange and red are not logically related. Some things are both; some are neither; some are the first but not the second; some are the second but not the first. So Searle's requirements again disqualify his paradigm. (A similar objection occurs in Sanford, 1970, pp. 162–163.)

4. The Munsell Color Solid

In order to construct more exact color examples, this entry will begin to specify colors by reference to the Munsell Color Solid and will use the color designations in the Inter-Society Color Council-National Bureau of Standards (ISCC-NBS) system (see Kelly and Judd, 1976, and the entry “Color” in Webster's Third Unabridged Dictionary, or Munsell: The Universal Language of Color). These standard color designation names such as deep yellow and dark grayish yellow are hereafter printed in boldface. There are 267 names in all, and a number from 1 to 267 is associated with each name. Although the context usually makes it clear when we are talking about (mentioning) a word and when we are using the word to talk about what the word is about, the difference between bold face and the ordinary font will also observe the customary use/mention distinction. The predicate deep yellow refers to the color deep yellow.

            There are other recognized representations of color space.  Projects in the physics of color, psychophysics, color science, and the philosophy of color often use one or more of these rather than the Munsell system. The Munsell system functions as it was intended to by providing a universal objective standard for very close color matching.   It is especially well suited to the purpose of this article because it provides a large number of quite determinate, but not completely determinate, color predicates.  Practical usefulness, rather than a philosophical need for examples, led to the demarcation of these narrow extensions.

Any pair of surface colors that the human eye can distinguish with respect to any color dimension, hue, brightness, or saturation (chroma), corresponds to a pair of points in The Munsell Color Solid. Estimates of the number of distiguishable colors range from two million to five million. For all practical purposes, one can regard the Munsell Color Solid as a continuum of colors. Pictures of the Munsell Color Solid, however, often depict the whole solid as contstructed out of 267 blocks of uniform determinate color (as in the color plates in Webster's Third or The 267 Color Centroids). These standard color names are ambiguous between determinate and determinable. For each of the 267 regions in the color solid, there is a determinate representative color, the ‘center of gravity’ or centroid color. These are the colors of the Centroid Color Chips that science and commerce use to standardize color descriptions of minerals, paint, dye, ink, plastic, and so forth. Pale yellow is both the name of a determinate centroid color and a determinable color. The scientists who construct the color solid regard the determinable use as primary.

There are many pairs of easily distinguishable colors which receive in this system the same designation, while there are also many pairs that can scarcely be distinguished which receive different designations. This property is, of course, an unavoidable result of dividing the color solid into an arbitary number of blocks, one for each of the 267 designations. Analogous disadvantages result for identifying the time of events according to date; two events occurring on the same date may be separated by many hours, but on the other hand two scarcely separable midnight events may have to be assigned different dates (Kelly and Judd, 1976. p. 4).

In all the forthcoming uses of the Munsell color names, they should be understood as names of determinables rather than determinates. There are distinguishable instances of pale yellow and some of these pairs are more easily distinguished than some pairs in which one color is pale yellow and the other is grayish yellow.

The bold face of the standard names contrasts in this entry with the upper case italics of invented names defined by means of the standard names. Some forthcoming definitions have the following pattern:

WEAK YELLOW: pale yellow or grayish yellow (89 or 90)

ROBUST YELLOW: strong yellow or moderate yellow or grayish yellow (84 or 87 or 90).

In the color solid, the regions corresponding to WEAK YELLOW and ROBUST YELLOW are as compact as any of the standard regions. These color names are as comprehensible as the standard names although, of course, they are more determinable. Weak yellow and robust yellow overlap because anything that is grayish yellow is both weak yellow and robust yellow. Neither entails the other.

Kelly and Judd contains thirty-one color charts (not themselves printed in color) that represent cross sections of the Color Solid. The vertical axis represents lightness (Munsell Value), and the horizontal axis represents saturation (Munsell Chroma). All colors that are not on the black-gray-white lightness axis have the same hue. Figure 2 is a reproduction of a chart for yellow (Kelly and Judd, 1976, p. 22) that represents the relation between pale yellow, grayish yellow, and other colors.

figure 2
Figure 2

5. After Searle

John Woods attempts to improve Searle's definitions in “On Species and Determinates” (Woods, 1967). As Richmond Thomason demonstrates with a remorseless barrage of difficulties, Woods's efforts only make things worse, if this is possible (Thomason, 1969). Woods's requirements for determinables have, for example, the unwelcome consequence that if Gx is a determinable, Gx is a theorem of predicate logic (Thomason, 1969, pp. 95–96).

Without offering a rigorous proof, Thomason offers the opinion that the overall project of defining species-genus and determinate-determinable in terms only of entailment and negation is doomed. He proceeds “to search for an abstract, structural characterization” (p. 97) and finds an appropriate structure in the algebraic theory of semi-lattices. The resulting elegant theory is probably useful to theorists who develop taxonomic schemes. It does not, however, appear to help with the problems that Körner and Searle confront. What disqualifies colored or rectangular as a determinable of red? What disqualifies red and square as a determinate of colored?

Besides proposing lattice-theoretic requirements for natural kinds. Thomason recommends a principle of disjointness (D) (p. 98) for taxonomic systems that can be stated as follows:

(D) If two natural kinds a and b of a taxonomic system share at least one member, then every member of a is a member of b, or every member of b is a member of a.

The two kinds red and darkish red or darkish orange fail to satisfy (D). They cannot both be natural kinds of the same taxonomic system. The algebraic theory of semi-lattices by itself provides no reason for favoring one or the other or neither as a natural kind. Many systems of classification appear not to accord with (D). In systems of biological, physical, and chemical taxonomy, its enforcement appears arbitrary.

Although one may nevertheless attempt to respect principle (D), it is important to realize that not every system that respects (D) divides the color solid into natural kinds. Here is another definition in terms of Munsell classification:

BELLOW: pale yellow or deep blue (89 or 179).

Something pale yellow can change to grayish yellow by continuously becoming a little bit darker and without changing at all in hue or saturation and without occupying regions in the color solid other than 89 or 90. Nothing pale yellow can change to deep blue in the same way. Either the change is discontinuous or the thing occupies many regions other than 89 and 179. The predicate pale yellow or dark blue (BELLOW) is a disjunction of two determinate predicates but does not itself correspond to a determinate. Pale yellow or grayish yellow (WEAK YELLOW) is determinable with respect to its disjuncts and is a suitable determinate of ‘colored.’ Disjunctive or conjunctive syntactic forms by themselves are unreliable guides to naturalness or being a proper determinate or determinable

Dean Zimmerman (1997) has also suggested improvements to Searle's treatment of determinables. He uses, in addition to the notion of predicate or property entailment, the notion of the Boolean part of a property. For further information and a critical discussion of Zimmerman's suggestion, see the Supplement on Boolean Parts of Properties.

6. Predicates and Properties

Philosophical discussion often slides back and forth between talk of predicates and talk of properties. Some philosophers suggest that there is an important logical difference between disjunctive predicates, on the one hand, and disjunctive properties or universals, on the other.

In a brisk Introduction to his early book Problems of Mind and Matter, in a section entitled “Generic and Specific,” John Wisdom says:

The fact is red and hard and red or hard are not universals; for strictly there are no conjunctive or disjunctive universals but only conjunctive and disjunctive facts. “This is red or hard” means “Either this is red or this is hard.” (Wisdom, 1963, p. 31)

D. M. Armstrong says something very similar about disjunctive properties (1978, p. 19–23). (Armstrong is willing to admit conjunctive properties.) A disjunction of property predicates such as ‘red’ and ‘hard’ is not itself a disjunctive property predicate. There is no property of being red or hard although the disjuncts of the meaningful predicate ‘red or hard’ do (or might) correspond to the properties red and hard.

At this point the following distinction is relevant:

  1. For some property predicates F and G, the compound predicate F or G is not itself a property predicate.
  2. For all property predicates F and G (that do not necessarily have the same extension), the compound predicate F or G is not itself a property predicate.

A metaphysician of properties can accept (1) or not. Accepting (2) is not an option. (2) is unacceptable. Armstrong writes:

Disjunctive properties offend against the principle that a genuine property is identical in its different particulars. Suppose a has a property P but lacks Q, while b has Q but lacks P. It seems laughable to conclude from these premisses that a and b are identical to some respect. Yet both have the “property”, P or Q. (1978, p. 20)

Something that satisfies the first disjunct of the following predicate need not be identical to or resemble in any relevant respect something that satisfies the second disjunct: ‘More than ten million miles from Memphis or sings “All of Me” off key.’ This example is intended to be a disjunction of laughably unrelated components. Not every predicate of the form P or Q is good for a laugh in this way.

Perhaps there is no current consensus about the accepted meanings to the technical phrases ‘disjunctive predicate’ and ‘conjunctive predicate.’ If that is so, then the following principles are useful suggestions for fixing their meanings, ‘a’ stands here for ‘acceptable’ and ‘u’ stands for ‘unacceptable’:

(Conj-a) If predicates F and G are equivalent (necessarily apply to the same things), then F is conjunctive if and only if G is also conjunctive.

(Disj-a) If predicates F and G are equivalent, then F is disjunctive if and only if G is also disjunctive.

On the other hand, it is useful to reject both the following principles:

(Conj-u) If F is equivalent to a predicate of the form K and L, then F is conjunctive.

(Disj-u) If F is equivalent to a predicate of the form K or L then F is disjunctive.

According to (Conj-u) and (Disj-u), all predicates are both conjunctive and disjunctive. Even redundant predicates such as F and F and F or F demonstrate this result. Additional qualifications can of course eliminate these particular examples. Then there will be more examples with undesirable consequences, and more qualifications to eliminate them. So long as the qualifications must be expressed in the terms of standard logical dependence and independence, the project recapitulates the efforts of Searle and Woods.

According to (Conj-a) and (Disj-a), Wisdom and Armstrong can agree that disjunctive predicates do not stand for properties or universals and they can disagree about whether conjunctive predicates stand for properties or universals. Wisdom says they don't, Armstrong thinks that the arguments against disjunctive universals do not apply to conjunctive universals. Everyone should agree that if a predicate F is equivalent to a disjunction of two different property predicates, F may be disjunctive or may not. That depends on how the disjuncts are related. Similar remarks apply to conjunctive predicates.

Some earlier examples of predicates, or similar predicates, appear in the following list:

  1. pale yellow or grayish yellow (WEAK YELLOW),
  2. pale yellow or deep blue (BELLOW),
  3. (greater than 5 and less than 7) or (greater than 4 and less than 6),
  4. (greater than 5 and less than 7) and (greater than 4 and less than 6),
  5. yellow or angry,
  6. yellow and angry.

So far as one can discriminate just by means of predicate entailment or the presence or absence of logical relations, (A) and (B) are similar. Each is a disjunction of predicates that exclude each other.

Pale yellow and grayish yellow do not differ with respect to hue or saturation. They differ in brightness only to the extent necessary to have distinct locations in the Munsell color solid. Pale yellow and grayish yellow are determinate with respect the determinable weak yellow, and weak yellow in turn is determinate with respect to yellow.

Bellow is not a determinate color with respect to the determinable color. One wants to deny that it is a color at all, even though BELLOW is equivalent to a disjunction of color predicates.

Predicates (A)and (B) contrast sharply. Pale yellow and grayish yellow are as similar as they can be while still excluding each other. Pale yellow and deep blue are about as dissimilar as two colors can be. Direct ungrounded appeals to resemblance or being in the same dimension or having to do with one another will not solve our problem. A theoretically satisfactory treatment of the determinate-determinable relation should explain these resemblances rather than be explained by them. A new technical term disjoint marks the apparent difference between (A) and (B). Pale yellow and deep blue are disjoint predicate. Pale yellow and grayish yellow are not disjoint. The next section provides a definition of disjointness.

So far as one can discriminate just by means of predicate entailment or the presence or absence of logical relations, the components of (C) and (D) are logically unrelated. But (C) is not a conjunctive predicate, and (D) is not a disjunctive predicate. Something that satisfies both disjuncts of (C), ‘greater than 5 and less than 7’ and ‘greater than 4 or less than 6,’ can change continuously so as to satisfy the first but not the second, or can change continuously in the other direction along the same dimension so as to satisfy the second but not the first. ‘Greater than 5 and less than 7’ and ‘greater than 4 and less than 6’ obviously indicate overlapping intervals along the same dimension. (C) is a long-winded way of expressing ‘greater than 4 and less than 7’ which has no appearance of being disjunctive. In the same way, (D) is a long-winded way of expressing greater than 5 and less than 6’ which has no appearance of being conjunctive.

So far as one can discriminate just by means of predicate entailment or the presence or absence of logical relations, the components of (E) and (F), these components are related to each other in the same way as those of (C) and (D). ‘Yellow’ and ‘angry’ are logically independent. A puzzle that the Korner-Searle Symposium poses is still unsolved. (E) is a disjunctive predicate. ‘Yellow’ is not a determinate of the determinable ‘yellow or angry’. (F) is a conjunctive predicate. ‘Yellow and angry’ is not a determinate of the determinable ‘yellow.’

Logically independent predicates can be determinates under the same determinable. ‘Yellow’ and ‘angry’ have an independence of a kind, indicated here by the new technical term B-independence, that has conditions in addition to those for logical independence. The next section specifies some conditions of B-independence.

Sections 3 to 7 of this article attend to the notion of disjunctive and conjunctive predicates. Since this section is titled “Predicates and Properties”, it is appropriate here to discuss some issues in which the distinction between predicates and properties intersects the distinction between determinables and determinates in ways not explicitly connected with conjunctive and disjunctive. Any general philosophic discussion of properties would extend vastly beyond the intended scope of this entry. The philosophic topic of universals has been at the center of first philosophy from Plato through medieval thought to the present. An example involving determinables can illustrate almost any view about properties. The brief discussion here treats only some current philosophic positions about determinates and determinables whose formulation requires positive or negative claims about properties.

D. M. Armstrong begins Chapter 4, “Properties II,” of Armstrong 1997 by saying:

We come now to consider one of most difficult issues in the theory of universals. Not only do particulars resemble, but so do properties and relations. And just as particulars may resemble each other more or less closely, so the same is true of properties and relations (47).

When A and B are neither identical nor distinct, some part of A is identical to some part of B, and either (1) some part of A is not identical to any part of B, or some part of B is not identical to any part of A. This yields three possibilities: (1) but not (2): A includes B; (2) but not (1): B includes A; both (1) and (2): they overlap although neither includes the other. Armstrong regards these all as partial identity (1997, p. 18). He extends the notion of partial identity to cases of non-spatial inclusion and overlap.

Armstrong develops the idea that ‘the resemblance of determinate universals is constituted by partial identity, where the greater the resemblance the greater degree of identity’ (p. 51). One example is duration. ‘The resemblances of all the determinate durations under a single determinable is a matter of partial identity’ (p. 55). For any two durations, there will be a duration that is part of each. This duration in common provides the partial identity.

What does this view imply about the number of duration properties? If there is a fundamental duration d (a temporal atom) not partly identical with any shorter duration, such that every longer duration is exactly a whole number n times longer than d, then perhaps d is the only fundamental duration property. (Or perhaps there are incommensurable fundamental durations? If there are two kinds d and d′, for example, neither is partly identical to the other, and every longer duration is the sum of n times d plus the sum of m times d′. Armstrong advocates an “a posteriori realism” (p. 25). There are no uninstantiated properties or universals. Which ones exist depend on how the world happens to be. So which fundamental duration properties exist, if any? The necessary existence of infinitely many fundamental durations, and also the necessary existence of any specific kinds of fundamental durations, seems to be contrary to the spirit of a posteriori realism. The eternity of time in one or both directions appears to be irrelevant to the question. If the theory of partial identity works at all, it should work for long durations, for a long duration is partly identical to any shorter durations it contains.

If there are no fundamental durations, then any duration of n seconds is partly identical to any shorter duration it contains. This view entails that there are infinitely many non-equivalent ways of dividing an interval. Taking halves, halves of halves, halves of halves of halves, and so forth, for example, will not produce the same durations as taking thirds, thirds of thirds, thirds of thirds of thirds, and so forth. There appears to be no principle for preferring one way of regarding a duration as partly identical to its constituents to infinitely many other ways.

What might provide a partial identity analogous to duration in the case of color? Nothing phenomenally apparent seems to play this role. Armstrong insists that very complex physical processes underlie phenomenally simple color appearances. He speculates that these physical processes provide the partial identities that constitute the resemblances between color properties (pp. 58–9). A developed physical theory that specifies the respect in which a determinate red and a determinate blue are partially identical might transform discussions of this topic.

In many writings on universals Armstrong rejects the principles that every meaningful predicate corresponds to a property. Other authors advance views specifically about whether determinable or determinate predicates correspond to properties.

Lawrence Lombard uses a broad sense of determinable that he connects both with criteria of identity and with being a metaphysical category (Lombard 1986, p. 41). Cynthia Macdonald makes similar use of a broad conception of determinable property in her general treatment of criteria of identity (Macdonald 2005, p. 60).

Eric Funkhouser uses the notion of a ‘determination dimension’. The notion of a determination dimension explains the limited ways in which determinates specify the determinables they fall under. Proper subsets arise only from a further specification along determination dimensions, so our analysis does not let specifications like red and square count as a determinate of red. Red and square does not have more precise values along the hue, brightness, or saturation dimension than does red (Funkhouser 2006).

The question remains on what grounds we deny that having a shape and a color is a determination dimension. Agreeing with Funkhauser that we want to deny it, because we want to preserve the results we hope to explain, we can ask about the theoretical grounds for the denial in addition to our desire to attain these results.

A paper by Ingvar Johansson and one by Carl Gillett and Bradley Rives both argue that there are absolutely determinate mind-independent properties. (Section 8 of this entry examines the subject of absolute determinacy.) They disagree about the status of determinables. Johansson holds that the highest determinables such as color and volume are objective properties. Intermediate concepts such as red and orange on the other hand, those neither most nor least specific, ‘cannot refer to ontological determinables.’ The limits of these concepts are conventional (Johansson 2000).

Gillett and Rives disagree with Johansson about the reality of determinables. They argue that the recognition of genuine determinable properties is unnecessary to causal explanation and a causal theory of properties. Determinates can do all the work. In particular, determinates contribute all the causal powers that determinable appear to explain.

Even if statements about causal powers do not presuppose the existence of determinables, Gillett and Rives should contend with others kind of causal statement. An experimental psychologist reports that the presentation of the appropriate mask 50 to 100 milliseconds after the target disc is a necessary condition of a certain phenomenon. This statement about a causally necessary condition does not entail that some more determinate time lag is a necessary condition. Regarding a determinable such as between 50 and 100 milliseconds as equivalent to an infinite disjunction of determinates might allow uninstantiated properties into the ontology. The number of uninstantiated determinate disjuncts involved by many other determinables such as alloyed with more than one gram but less than a metric ton of gold is certainly huge. The view that determinables are equivalent to infinite disjunctions of determinates seems to be consistent, it also seems to run counter to the goal of Gillett and Rives to achieve a sparse ontology.

7. Boundaries and Borderlines

B-independence’ stands for ‘boundary independence.’ The Munsell Color Solid is composed of non-overlapping regions that all share boundaries with other regions. The preliminary discussion in this section departs for a while from colors to consider a familiar, two-dimensional array of non-overlapping regions, the states in the United States. In case a map of the United States is not close at hand, the reader can look at Figure 3, a simple map of the some of the states that figure in the following examples.

figure 3
Figure 3

Some spatial analogies about the boundaries of states and other regions composed of the states will motivate the forthcoming discussion of disjoint and B-independent predicates. Here are two disjunctive definitions:

x is in the Dakotas =df x is in North Dakota or x is in South Dakota.

x is in the North States =df x is in North Dakota or x is in North Carolina.

In each case, the disjuncts exclude each other. North Dakota and South Dakota have no points in common. Neither do North Dakota and North Carolina. Predicate entailment fails to capture a topological difference between the Dakotas and the North States. The Dakotas are a coherent, continuous region. The North States are a discontinuous region. Something can be both on the boundary of North Dakota and on the boundary of South Dakota. Nothing can be both on the boundary of North Dakota and on the boundary of North Carolina, for their boundaries are many miles apart. North Dakota and North Carolina are disjoint. North Dakota and South Dakota are not disjoint.

There is a close analogy here with some the color examples in the last section. Weak yellow is a coherent, continuous region in the quality space of color. Bellow is a discontinuous region. Something can be both on the boundary of pale yellow and on the boundary of grayish yellow. Nothing can be both on the boundary of pale yellow and deep blue. This is a topological difference that predicate entailment does not represent.

Here are two more disjunctive geographical definitions. In the first definition, the disjuncts exclude each other:

x is in Dabraksa =df x is in South Dakota or x is in Nebraska.

In the second definition, the disjuncts overlap; they are logically independent; neither includes the other; they do not jointly exhaust the total space:

x is in Longkota =df x is in the Dakotas or x is in Dabraska.

Longkota is a coherent, continuous region. There is nothing inherently disjunctive about it. Boundary relations again indicate topological relations between the Dakotas and Dabraska that logical entailment and non-entailment do not capture. Consider something A on the boundary of South Dakota and Minnesota and Iowa. It is on the boundary of the Dakotas and on the boundary of Debraska and on the boundary of Longkota. But it is not on the boundary of the following two regions:

x is in the Dakotas but x is not in Debraska (that is, x is in North Dakota)

x is in Debraska but x is not in the Dakotas (that is, x is in Nebraska).

A is not close to any boundary of North Dakota or Nebraska.

One of our main puzzle predicates, ‘yellow or angry,’ presents a topological contrast. Anything A on the boundary of ‘yellow’ and on the boundary of ‘angry’ is also on the boundary of the following four predicates:

‘yellow and angry’
‘yellow but not angry’
‘angry but not yellow’
‘neither angry nor yellow’

This reflects the fact that being yellow and being angry are conceptually independent besides being logically independent. Slight changes in a that would move it from the boundary of ‘yellow’ to being definitely yellow or definitely not yellow are independent of slight changes in a that would move it from the boundary of ‘angry’ to being definitely angry or definitely not angry.

It is possible to define a color predicate analogous to Longkota. This definition uses two earlier definitions that are repeated here:

ROBUST YELLOW: strong yellow or moderate yellow or grayish yellow.

WEAK YELLOW: pale yellow or grayish yellow

SWELL YELLOW: WEAK YELLOW or ROBUST YELLOW.

The disjuncts of this last definition are logically independent. Nevertheless, SWELL YELLOW corresponds to a coherent continuous region in color space. Weak yellow and robust yellow have a topological relation that yellowness and anger do not have. There are locations in the Munsell Color Solid (for example, on the borderline of grayish yellow and on the borderline of light olive brown), where something x at this location is on the boundary of weak yellow and on the boundary of robust yellow and on the boundary of swell yellow but is not on the boundary of the following two regions:

Weak yellow but not robust yellow.
Robust yellow but not weak yellow.

Although the predicates WEAK YELLOW and ROBUST YELLOW are logically independent, relations between the boundaries of their regions indicate a significant, objective connection.

Although pale yellow is a highly determinate color predicate relative to ‘yellow’, it is far from being maximally determinate. A sentence from Kelly and Judd, quoted above in Section 4, is repeated here:

There are many pairs of easily distinguishable colors which receive in this system the same designation, while there are also many pairs that can scarcely be distinguished which receive different designations(Kelly and Judd, 1976. p. 4).

Despite its relative specificity, pale yellow applies to samples that are visibly different with respect to color. The same goes for grayish yellow. So something can change gradually from pale yellow to grayish yellow. Is there some point along the way that is the precise boundary between these two color regions? This is a specific form of a question that divides philosophers who develop theories of vagueness. Without needing to adopt some view about the basic nature of borderline cases, one can admit the possibility of borderline cases between pale yellow and grayish yellow. It is possible that something can be on the borderline of each region. Something is a borderline case of pale yellow if it is neither definitely pale yellow nor definitely not pale yellow.

Körner also uses a logic of inexact concepts to treat ‘yellow or angry.’ One of Searle's complaints about Körner is that “His definition excludes any exact concept as a possible candidate for a determinate” (Searle, 1959, p. 156). Does this objection apply to the suggestions in this section? The next section returns to the question whether there are perfectly exact concepts. Borderline cases are used in this section to locate boundaries. Suppose that ‘more than five feet tall but less than six feet tall’ is perfectly exact. Anything just slightly taller than five feet or just slightly shorter than six feet is on the boundary. For the purposes of exploring relations to other predicates, we can replace an exact predicate with one that it slightly inexact. For example, amend the definition of the allegedly exact predicate by adding ‘so far as one can tell by using a wall, a pencil, a carpenter's level, and a yardstick.’ The definitions as amended definitely apply to some things, definitely do not apply to others, and also have some borderline cases left over. (Following a harmless practice, this article refers both to borderline cases of predicates and to borderline cases of properties or regions.)

This project treats borderlines and boundaries as interchangeable. The following is an attempt to generalize and formalize the suggestions made above:

The ‘B’ operator is used to talk about boundaries and borderline cases. ‘BFx’ means ‘x is a borderline case of F.’

The definition of disjoint predicates promised at the end of the section follows:

Fx and Gx are disjoint predicates if and only if Fx and Gx are exclusive predicates and For any x, if BFx, then not-BGx.

Disjoint predicates do not, or in a modal version, cannot, share borderline cases. A predicate is exclusively disjunctive if and only it is equivalent to a disjunction of disjoint predicates.

A specification of a condition of B-independence was also promised at the end of Section 5. Let us say that two predicates Fx and Gx intersect if and only if there is something x such that:

B(F & G)x & B(F & not-G)x & B(not-F & G)x & (not-F & not-G)x.

The boundaries of B-independent predicates not only intersect; they intersect wherever they have a point in common. Fx and Gx are B-independent only if:

For any x, if BFx and BGx, then B(F & G)x & B(F & not-G)x & B(not-F & G)) & B(not-F & not-G)x.

A predicate is inclusively disjunctive only if it is equivalent to a disjunction of B-independent predicates. A predicate is conjunctive only if it is equivalent to a conjunction of B-independent predicates. ‘Yellow or angry’ is inclusively disjunctive. WEAK YELLOW or ROBUST YELLOW is not inclusively disjunctive. ‘Yellow and angry’ is conjunctive. ‘WEAK YELLOW and ROBUST YELLOW’ is not conjunctive.

This approach appears to solve the puzzle that Körner formulated and that Searle and others attempted to solve without success. Conjunctive predicates do not correspond to determinates. Disjunctive predicates do not correspond to determinables.

The discussion above provides only a necessary condition of B-independence. Attempting to deal with Nelson Goodman's puzzle about ‘grue’ and other perverse artificial predicates requires reference to more complicated relations between boundary conditions. These further conditions which are represented as both necessary and sufficient for B-independence are not spelled out here. They appear, in successive versions, in three articles by Sanford 1970, 1981 (in which the later parts are nearly incomprehensible because of over-compression and lack of diagrams), and 1994 (which has some diagrams). All three articles attempt to clarify the determinate-determinable relation by explaining the nature of disjunctive and conjunctive predicates.

8. Absolute Determinacy

“The practical impossibility of literally determinate characterization must be contrasted with the universally adopted postulate that the characters of things which we can only characterise more or less indeterminately, are, in actual fact, absolutely determinate.” This is the final sentence of W. E. Johnson's chapter “The Determinable.” Johnson is not the only philosopher who holds that things are absolutely determinate. In Section 3 I mention several philosophers who maintain that there are absolutely determinate properties. One of D. M. Armstrong's six numbered refutations of phenomenalism in Armstrong (1961) maintains that “physical objects, which are determinate, cannot be constructions out of indeterminate sense-impressions” (p. 58).

A physical object is determinate in all respects, it has a perfectly precise colour, temperature, size, etc. It makes no sense to say that a physical object is light-blue in colour, but is no definite shade of light blue. (p. 59)

Understanding what it is for color, temperature, size, etc., predicates to be perfectly precise helps in understanding what it is for color, temperature, size, etc., properties to be perfectly precise. A precise predicate is not vague; it is exact rather than inexact; it has no borderline cases. Precision contrasts with vagueness.

Specificity, on the other hand, contrasts with generality. Light blue is more specific than ‘blue’ which is more specific than ‘colored.’ The more specific a predicate, the narrower the range it covers. Is light blue more specific than ‘smooth’? The absence of an inclusion relation in either direction makes it difficult to answer this question. Attempts actually to compare the numerical results after counting all the light blue things in the world and all the smooth things can lead only to frustration and failure. This entry does not address the problem of comparing degrees of specificity of determinates under different determinables.

Specificity and exactness are independent in several ways. There can be predicates F and G such that:

F and G are not identical and are both unspecific and inexact. For example: F: about the size of a cat, G: about the size of a dog.

F is more specific and more exact than G. Example: F: pale yellow and G: yellow (in the ordinary rather inclusive sense).

F is more specific than G, and G is more exact than F. Example: F: about the size of a cat. G: has a volume not less than 50.3 cubic inches and not more than 2000.8 cubic inches. Anything F is G and not everything G is F, so F is more specific than G. But G is more exact. It requires, at the boundaries, determination to the nearest tenth of a cubic inch.

F and G are both specific and exact. Examples: F: pale yellow, G: deep blue. Neither of these color predicates is absolutely precise, but each is quite precise compared to ordinary color terms. The Munsell Color Solid is constructed with the intention that each of the 267 regions has approximately the same degree of specificity.

Although specificity and precision are independent in these ways, they are also significantly connected with respect to absolute determinacy. Any absolutely specific predicate is also absolutely precise. Suppose, for example, that ‘Armstrong blue’ is a predicate for an absolutely specific shade of blue. Two things that are Armstrong blue do not differ at all with respect to hue or brightness or saturation. Given a predicate ‘F’ and two objects a and b such that a is a borderline case of ‘F’ and b is a definite positive case of ‘F’, a and b differ along some relevant dimension. But anything that differs along any relevant dimension from something that is definitely F, when ‘F’ is an absolutely specific predicate, is not F. Absolutely specific predicates cannot have borderline cases.

No predicate that can have borderline cases is absolutely specific. So if there are no absolutely precise or exact predicates, neither are there absolutely specific predicates. Johnson presumably would not question this conclusion since he says that literally determinate characterization is practically impossible. He and Armstrong claim things in the world are absolutely determinate, not the predicates we do or could use to apply to things in the world.

If things in the world are absolutely determinate, this presumably does not require that any absolute determination persists through the passage of time or space. If a cumulus cloud changes continuously in shape and size, this does not by itself preclude its having, at any one time, an absolutely determinate shape and size. The impression that clouds do not have exact boundaries, however, is probably not based entirely on their changeability.

Objects with absolutely determinate sizes have absolutely determinate boundaries. If a thing has an absolutely determinate length along some axis at a given time, then there is exactly one real number n such that its length in (say) meters is n. Things that we come across in ordinary life such as plants, animals, buildings, furniture, electronic equipment, clothing, and kitchenware do not have exact boundaries, nor do larger items such as mountains, lakes, continents, and stars.

The view that things in the world are absolutely determinate is implausible if it requires clouds, brains, and dinner plates to be absolutely determinate. But this requirement can be put aside. If the microstructure of the world is absolutely determinate, that is absolute determinacy enough. If all the atoms within you and in your vicinity have absolutely determinate properties, then the indeterminate mass and shape and volume of you, your brain, and your teeth somehow supervene on the determinate microstructure. Here is a well-known passage from David Lewis:

The reason it's vague where the outback begins is not that there's this thing, the outback, with imprecise borders; rather there are many things, with different borders, and nobody has been fool enough to try to enforce a choice of one of them as the official referent of the word ‘outback.’ (Lewis, 1986, p. 212)

The view that there are many things with precise borders does not by itself refute the view that there are things with imprecise borders. Here is a kind of parody of the passage just quoted. It ends with the same point but begins with a contrary contention:

The outback is a big thing, and it is vague where it begins. The reason it has imprecise borders is that there are many things, with different precise borders, and nobody has been fool enough to enforce a choice of one of them as the official reference of the word ‘outback’.

For the outback (a cloud, your brain), there are many more-or-less precise aggregates of particles such that each is about as good a candidate as there is to be identified with the outback (a cloud, your brain). This entry does not address the problem of the many, how to understand the relation between a single macro-object and many overlapping aggregates of micro-objects that more or less coincide with it.

However one resolves the problem of the many, the question of absolute determinacy becomes the question of absolute determinacy of the physical basis, the microstructure. After quoting the passage from Lewis above, Roberto Casati and Achille Varzi write:

There are plenty of objects out there—plenty of slightly distinct and yet precisely determinate aggregates of land molecules. And when we say ‘Mount Everest’ or ‘the outback’, each one of a large variety of such aggregates—each with its own perfectly crisp mereotopological structure—has an equal claim to being a referent of that term. (Casati and Varzi, 1999, p. 95)

And what evidence is there for this precisely determinate perfect crispness? Logic and metaphysics cannot answer this question from its own resources. Science textbooks represent particles and atoms as clouds. Textbook writers fifty years ago knew that the picture of perfect little spheres, the electrons, in elliptical orbits around a nucleus was misleading. Now the picture is simply obsolete.

An attempt to measure the precise dimensions of a polished copper cube might begin using an ordinary school supply ruler, then using a machinist's steel rule, then using a micrometer, then, starting with a low power optical microscope, using a series of increasingly powerful microscopes. At the microscopic level one can discriminate increments of length too small for a mechanical micrometer to detect. This does not produce a more precise determination of the length of the cube if nothing at this level coincides with the boundary of the cube. So the search for the exact measurements of the cube is abandoned and replaced by a hope to find absolute determinacy somewhere at the foundations, the fundamental basis, or the limit. There is a (weak) kind of non-deductive argument here.

Given a greatest degree of precision determined by the best instruments, sooner or later a more advanced technology produces instruments that are still more precise. This process of making measurement increasingly precise never ends; it asymptotically approaches absolute precision at dimensionless points of matter or spacetime or something.

This vision of absolute determinacy at the limit is apparently attractive. It appears to be internally consistent. It also appears, however, to be inconsistent with physics.

Middle-sized objects do not have perfectly precise boundaries because there are microscopic objects that are neither definitely included nor definitely excluded from the object. Some larger microscopic objects lack perfectly precise boundaries for the same reason. There is no reason to believe that this process continues infinitely downward. Electron diameters are imprecise, but not because there are swarms of micro-electron-dust, each particle of which is also a swarm of something even smaller. Nor does the process stop with some basic items that really are absolutely determinate.

Instruments can measure the velocity of a tennis ball. They do not, of course, measure velocity with absolutely determinacy. They do not discriminate, say, 114.0 from 114.1 miles per hour. Given some understanding of margins of error, it is meaningful for one to say that a tennis ball was going 114 miles per hour at some temporal instant t. The notions of a limit and of convergence provide this meaning. They provide no support for believing in the possibility of a momentary tennis ball that exists neither before instant t nor after instant t but does exist precisely at instant t and travels 114 miles per hour during its instantaneous existence. If it is possible for something to have a property for an instant, it does not follow that an instantaneous thing can have that property.

The same goes for spatial points. If it is possible for something to have a property at a point, it does not follow that it is possible that something punctiform should have this property. When a region is pale yellow, we can say that any point in the region is pale yellow. But no point by itself can be pale yellow.

Johnson said that it is a “universally adopted postulate that the characters of things which we can only characterise more or less indeterminately, are, in actual fact, absolutely determinate.” In saying it is a postulate, Johnson does not mean we merely assume it in order to deduce its consequences. He means rather that it is both obviously true and cannot be inferred from truths that are even more obvious. But the so-called postulate is not obviously true.

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