Supplement to Determinates vs. Determinables

Quality Order

Recall the three-place relation Dabc from Section 1.4: the difference between a and c is greater than that between a and b. But this does not mean that b is between a and c. As in Figure 1 (also from Section 1.4), it can still be consistent with the distance between b and c being greater than the distance between a and c.

figure 1
Figure 1

In this situation, b is not between a and c in any sense. For example, the difference (or distance) between red and yellow is greater than the distance between red and purplish red, but purplish red is not between red and yellow.

There is a similar difficulty with Mohan Matthen's suggestion about distance measure. A feature A that is a lot redder than another one B is more dissimilar to B than C which is only a little redder than B; this comparison can be captured by a distance measure: A is further away from B than from C (Matthen, 2005, pp. 107–8).

Consider the following instances:

C: pale yellow
A: pale orange
B: very slightly redder than dark olive brown

Compared to B, A is much redder than C. Although A and C are more dissimilar in respect of hue, overall they resemble each other more than either resembles B because they are both pale, quite close to white, not dark, quite close to black, and also because they do not differ maximally with respect to hue (yellow and orange are contiguous rather than opposed hues on the color wheel).

The word ‘betwixt’, which appears in the next paragraph, comes from Goodman (1951), pp. 244–253, but only the word, not Goodman's definition or intended sense. This is an occasion to remark that Goodman and Carnap (1928) develop constructions of quality order much more elaborate than Johnson's. They do not use a primitive equivalent to Dabc in their constructions. Johnson returns to questions of quality order in Part II of Logic, Chapter VII, “The Different Kinds of Magnitude.”

The following conjunctive definition, which overcomes this particular difficulty, is not a revision of a formulation by Johnson. It is the beginning, rather, of a brief attempt to define betweenness by means of Johnson's primitive Dabc: Let us say that b is betwixt a and c if and only if Dabc and Dcba. Orange, but not reddish purple, is betwixt red and yellow. Figure S2 adds to the circle in figure 1 another circle with the same radius with point c in the middle. A point b betwixt a and c is within the intersection of these two circles.

figure S2
Figure S2

Betwixtness is too wide a notion to explicate betweenness. Suppose that the points in Figure S3, a specification of Figure S2, stand for the following colors:

R: a fully saturated, bright sample of red
Y: a fully saturated, bright sample of yellow
O1: a fully saturated, bright sample of orange
O2: a less saturated, less bright sample of orange
figure S3
Figure S3

O1 and O2 are both betwixt R and Y. But it is natural to represent O1 as ‘right between’ R and Y. O2 is somewhat off to the side. A better definition of ‘between’ will count O1 but not O2 as between R and Y.

Relying again on the notion of distance, one can distinguish two senses of between. (1) B is somewhere between A and C if and only if the distance between A and B plus the distance between B and C is equal to the distance between A and C. That is, B is located somewhere on the straight line (in Euclidean space) between A and B. (2) B is exactly or halfway between A and B if and only if B is somewhere between A and C and also the distance between A and B is equal to the distance between B and C. The following definition, built on Johnson's primitive, attempts to define somewhere between in sense (1):

b is somewhere between a and c if and only if b is betwixt a and c, and nothing is both betwixt a and b and betwixt b and c.

When two circles with no interior points in common are tangent, the point in common is on the straight line segment between the two centers. Any point on a straight line segment between points x and y is the point in common between two circles with centers x and y that have no interior points in common. As Figure S4 illustrates, b is on a straight line segment between a and c if and only if the circle ab is tangent to the circle cb. This is the case if and only if nothing is betwixt a and b and also betwixt b and c; for any such thing has to be both an interior point of circle ab and an interior point of circle cb, and these circles have no interior points in common.

figure S4
Figure S4

Figure S5, illustrates a point b that is betwixt a and c but is not situated like point b in Figure S4. In this case, point b is on the intersection of two circle that have interior points in common. Figure S5 shows this region as a shaded area. Anything within this shaded area is both betwixt a and b and betwixt b and c.

figure 5
Figure S5

Although a distance between points in these diagrams can be equal, or double, or half, another distance between points, that is due to the conventions of drawing these diagrams. There has been no explication of these distance notions by means of the primitive Dabc. A definition of right between would provide a sufficient condition for the equality of the distance between a and b and the distance between b and c, but there is no attempt here to provide such a definition using only the primitive Dabc.

Copyright © 2011 by
David H. Sanford

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