Notes to Discourse Representation Theory

1. In describing Dynamic Semantics as fully compositional, we have chosen to lump together Groenendijk and Stokhof's (1991) Dynamic Predicate Logic, which is not compositional, with other systems which, while distinct in important respects, incorporate many of the same dynamic intuitions, and are compositional, e.g. the systems of Groenendijk and Stokhof (1989), Muskens (1996) (which Muskens himself describes as a version of DRT) and Beaver (2001).

2. Muskens (1996) discusses some limitations of the merge operation.

3. In the main text we discuss the issue of representationalism in terms of the treatment of anaphora and the treatment of attitudes. But Kamp's claim of the necessity of representations might be thought especially relevant to treatment of presuppositions outlined in §5.2, since this treatment involves particularly complex manipulations of DRSs. However, Zeevat (1989b) shows that essential aspects of this theory of presupposition can be captured using a model-theoretic information state rather than syntactic representations, albeit that the notion of information state becomes highly structured as a result.

Copyright © 2011 by
Bart Geurts <>
David I. Beaver <>

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