Notes to Émilie du Châtelet

1. Thanks to Andrew Janiak for alerting me to this fact.

2. For similar analyses of Du Châtelet's position on Descartes and Cartesianism, see Janik 1982, 87; Alic 1986 (139); Barber 1967 (208); and Hutton 2004a (517).

3. Material in this paragraph draws from Hettche 2009, Horn 2010, Look 2007, McCadden 1955, and Sleigh 1983.

4. Material in this paragraph draws from Della Rocca 2010, Hettche 2009, Look 2007, Melamed and Lin 2010, and Sleigh 1983.

5. Material in this paragraph is from Hettche 2009.

6. Hagengruber thinks Du Châtelet is committed to ‘innate ideas’ in opposition to Locke, and while I agree that she departs from Locke on this point, I do not think she is thus thrust directly into Descartes' camp on the issue of nativism (see below). See Ruth Hagengruber, ‘Émilie Du Châtelet between Leibniz and Newton: The Transformation of Metaphysics’ in Émilie Du Châtelet: Between Leibniz and Newton, edited by Ruth Hagengruber (London: Springer, 2012), 1–60.

7. Many thanks to Eileen O'Neill for suggesting various ways of interpreting the principle of contradiction, suggestions that helped clarify my thinking on this aspect of Du Châtelet's philosophy.

8. Voltaire to Maupertuis, 1 October 1738. In Voltaire, Correspondence and related documents, ed. Theodore Besterman. (Genève: Institut et Musée Voltaire, 1968–77), letter #1622. See Barber 1967, 220 for a detailed account of her rejection of Voltaire's extreme reaction against metaphysics.

9. Janik notes this as one of Du Châtelet's central physico-theological interests with her opinion solidifying in favor of intellectualism by 1740. See Janik 1982, 101 and 104. See also Robert Locqueneux 1995, 866. For her disagreement with Voltaire's approach because of its disadvantage in science, see Hagengruber 2012, 1–59.

10. Locke, An Essay Concerning Human Understanding, I, ii, §4, p. 49.

11. George Gale calls this sort of argument in Leibniz a “regressive metaphysical argument”. Gale 1970, 114–27. It may thus be taken to indicate that Du Châtelet uses the PSR to provide something like an inference to the best explanation. I am grateful to Eileen O'Neill for pointing this out to me.

12. For a careful account of Du Châtelet's metaphysics and relation to mechanics, including difficulties with Du Châtelet's own characterization of the nature of matter, see Iltis 1977, 29–48.

13. For an account of the role of Leibniz's, Wolff's, and ‘sGravesande's metaphysics in the Foundations, see Rey 2008, 231–42.

14. For a detailed analysis of the seventh and eighth chapters of the Foundations in order to make sense of the relation between Leibnizian and Newtonian ideas therein, see Gireau-Geneaux 2001, 173–186.

15. Portions of this section are adapted from Detlefsen (forthcoming), §I.

16. See Keiko Kawashima for her evaluation of Du Châtelet’s conceptual relationship with her close contemporaries on hypotheses. Kawashima 1993, 67–68, 67–68. For other discussions of Du Châtelet on hypothesis, see Hagengruber 2012, 1–59; and Hutton 2012, 77–95.

17. For aspects of this trend, including the connection with metaphysical systems, and with speculative versus experimental philosophy, see Anstey 2005, Condillac [1749] 1982, Hine 1979, Locqueneux 2001, Loveland 2001, Rosenfeld 1972, and Schwegman 2010.

18. Du Châtelet herself has a much more subtle – and arguably accurate – understanding of Newton’s methodology than do many of her contemporaries including, for example, Voltaire. More recent commentators who have looked more closely at Newton’s approach to hypotheses include Cohen 1966, Hanson 1970, and Janiak 2008, passim.

19. For Voltaire’s challenge of Descartes’ philosophy specifically because of his use of hypotheses, see Voltaire [1738] 1992, 337fn9, 401, and 699–700. For praise of Newton for avoiding the use of hypotheses, see Voltaire [1738] 1992, 729. For a direct comparison of the two to Descartes’ disadvantage and Newton’s advantage, see Voltaire [1738] 1992, 733–4.

20. For Du Châtelet’s overlap with and divergence from Descartes on the role played by hypotheses in scientific methodology, see Detlefsen (forthcoming).

21. For more on what the BnF manuscript can tell us about Du Châtelet’s evolving thought, she (Janiak and Detlefsen, forthcoming). Indeed, Du Châtelet’s work on hypothesis forms the foundations for the entry on hypotheses in Diderot’s Encyclopédie of 1765. Large portions of the entry on “hypothesis” are lifted almost verbatim from chapter 4 of her Foundations. For a discussion of the role various concepts from her Foundations play in the Encyclopédie, see Maglo 2008.

22. For more on these two approaches to hypothesis, including the understanding of those such as Kepler and Galileo who believed these methods to be compatible, see McMullin 2000, 316–7; and Friedman 2008, 71.

23. As helpfully pointed out by Lisa Downing, Du Châtelet’s claim that hypotheses become “truths” is not that surprising given that she very quickly discusses them in terms of “moral certainty”, a weaker claim than something being metaphysically or absolutely certain. The passage following, in which hypotheses are characterized as “poison” would then refer to hypotheses which have not attained a degree of confirmation that would make them morally certain.

24. Zinsser discusses this feature of Du Châtelet’s thought in Zinsser 2005, passim.

25. On this point, I dissent from Janik who believes that Du Châtelet uses the principle of sufficient reason as only a rational, not a causal, principle. Janik 1982, 104. Janik, however, seems to implicitly acknowledge that the causal aspect of that principle is at work in Du Châtelet’s thought. See Janik 1982, 104–5.

26. Du Châtelet’s chapter on hypotheses captures many aspects of Robert Boyle’s account of good and excellent hypotheses. Boyle in Westfall 1956, 103–17.

27. On Du Châtelet as systematizer, especially how she fits into Condillac's scheme of systems as presented in his Treatise on Systems, see Detlefsen (forthcoming).

28. Du Châtelet refers here to Newton's “Queries” appended to the Opticks, a set of extended questions and speculations on numerous questions within natural philosophy that were appended to successive editions of the text in its original English and in Latin translation. The Queries were set apart from the main text of the Opticks in order to underwrite their speculative nature. Du Châtelet then indicates that the analysis of attraction within Newton's other principal work, Principia mathematica, was not presented as speculative in nature, a feature of Newton's thought that was not always acknowledged by his followers during the early and mid eighteenth century.

29. This translation, including notation in the previous footnote, is courtesy of Andrew Janiak.

30. See Hutton 2004a, 521ff for a discussion of this point.

Copyright © 2014 by
Karen Detlefsen <detlefse@phil.upenn.edu>

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