Supplement to Epistemic Utility Arguments for Probabilism

Proof of Theorem 7

We wish to prove the following theorem (Joyce 1998):

Theorem 7. Suppose G satisfies:

  • Strongly Non-Trivial,
  • Proposition-Wise Continuity,
  • Unbounded,
  • Truth-Directed,
  • Strong Convexity,
  • Symmetry, and
  • Dominating Compromise.

Then:

  1. For every non-probabilistic b in BP, there is a probabilistic p in P that strongly dominates it.
  2. For every probabilistic p in P, there is no credence function b in B that weakly dominates it.

We do this by proving the following two lemmas:

Lemma 1 (de Finetti) P is the convex hull V+ of V. That is, P is the smallest set that (i) contains each valuation function v in V and (ii) contains λb + (1-λ)b whenever it contains b and b. In other words, if U has properties (i) and (ii), then V+U.

Lemma 2 (Joyce) Suppose G satisfies

  • Strongly Non-Trivial,
  • Proposition-Wise Continuity,
  • Unbounded,
  • Truth-Directed,
  • Strong Convexity,
  • Symmetry, and
  • Dominating Compromise.

Then:

  1. If bBV+, then there is p in V+ such that G(b, v) > G(p, v) for all v in V.
  2. If pV+, then there is no b in B such that G(p, v) ≥ G(b, v) for all v in V.

Proof of Lemma 1

We prove this in two stages: first we prove V+P and then we prove PV+.

  1. V+P. To prove this, we need only show that (i) VP and (ii) P contains λb + (1-λ)b whenever it contains b and b. It is straightforward to verify that every valuation function is a probability function. After all, the classical truth value of a disjunction AB of mutually exclusive propositions A and B is obtained by adding together the truth values of the disjuncts A and B. (ii) is straightforward arithmetic.
  2. PV+. To prove this, we must show that each p in P is a convex combination of the elements of V. That is, for each p in P, there is 0 ≤ λv ≤ 1 for each v in V such that Σ λv = 1 and p = Σ λvv. If this is true, then each probability function must belong to the convex hull V+ of V. To prove this, we use the notation ΣA to denote the sum over all worlds v that make A true. Σ without a subscript denotes the sum over all worlds v in V. Suppose p in P. And suppose A is a proposition in F. Then note that A is equivalent to the disjunction of all the atomic propositions v of F that entail A; and these atoms correspond to the valuation functions that make A true. Thus, since probability functions are finitely additive, for each proposition A in F,
    p(A)
      =  ΣA p(v)
      =  ΣA 0.p(v) + ΣA 1.p(v)
      =  Σp(v)v(A).

    Thus, p = Σp(v)v, as required.

This completes our proof.

Proof of Lemma 2

Suppose G satisfies Strongly Non-Trivial, Proposition-Wise Continuity, Unbounded, Truth-Directed, Strong Convexity, Symmetry, and Dominating Compromise. We begin by extending G from a measure of the distance between a credence function b and a valuation function v to a measure of the distance between any two credence functions b and b. We define D : B × B → ℜ in the following way:

D(b, c) := G(v + (bc), v)

for v in V. Since G is Truth-Directed, we have G(b, v) = G(c, v), if |b(A) − v(A)| = |c(A) − v(A)| for all A in F. From this, we can derive the following facts about our new distance measure D:

  • The definition of D does not depend on the valuation v in V used in its definition. That is, G(v + (bc), v) = G(v′ + (bc), v′) for all v, v′ in V.
  • D extends G. That is, for b in B and v in V, G(b, v) = D(b, v).
  • D is symmetric. That is, for all b, c in B, D(b, c) = D(c, b).

With the definition of D in hand, we can prove Lemma 2(1) and Lemma 2(2).

We begin with Lemma 2(1). We wish to show that each b in BV+ is strongly dominated by some p in V+. Thus, we let b be a credence function in BV+. And we consider the function D(b, •) : V+ → ℜ. This function takes a member of V+ and gives its distance from b. Now, it follows from Proposition-Wise Continuity that D(b, •) is continuous with respect to the Euclidean metric. Thus, we have that D(b, •) is a real-valued, continuous function on a closed, bounded subset of ℜn. The Extreme Value Theorem says that, for any such function, there is at least one member of its domain at which it takes a minimum value. That is, there is a p in V+ such that D(b, p) ≤ D(b, c), for all c in V+. In fact, by Strong Convexity and Symmetry, we can show that this minimum must be unique. If it weren't, we would have D(b, p), D(b, p′) ≤ D(b, c) for all c in V+. But then by Strong Convexity and Symmetry, we would have D(b, ½p + ½p′) < D(b, p), D(b, p′), which gives a contradiction, since ½p + ½p′ is in V+. In sum: for each b in BV+ there is a unique closest member of V+. We denote it p. Our next task is to show that, for all v in V, D(p, v) < D(b, v), and thus G(p, v) < G(b, v). That is, we must show that b is further than p from each valuation function v.

Suppose vV. If p = v, then by Strongly Non-Trivial, we have D(p, v) < D(b, v), and we're done. Thus, we suppose that pv. Let

R := {λp + (1-λ)v : -∞ < λ < ∞}

Thus, R is the straight line that passes through p and v and passes to infinity in both directions.

We now prove that there is some m that lies on the line R such that

  1. D(m, v) ≥ D(p, v)
  2. D(b, v D(m, v)

If we can show this, then we can put (1) and (2) together to give D(p, v) < D(b, v), as required. Consider the function D(b, •) on R. Again, this is a continuous, real-valued function on R. And, by Unbounded, D tends to infinity as we move away from v towards p and beyond. But since p is closest to b of all members of V+, it is closer to b than v is. That is, D(b, p) < D(b, v). Thus, the Intermediate Value Theorem gives us that there is a credence function k in R that lies beyond p on the line from v through p to infinity that is exactly the same distance from b and v is. That is, D(b, k) = D(b, v). Then, by Symmetry and Strong Convexity, ½k + ½v is the unique minimum of D(b, •) on the segment kv of this line. Let m be ½k + ½v. So m is the credence function that lies on the segment kv that is closest to b. We now prove that m satisfies (1) and (2) from above:

  • If m = p, then certainly D(m, v) ≥ D(p, v). Thus, suppose mp. First, we show that p lies on the line segment mv. Suppose not. Then m must lie on the line segment pv. But this line segment lies entirely inside V+. Thus, m is in V+ and it is closer to b than p is. But recall that p is the credence function in V+ that is closest to b. So we have a contradiction. Thus, p lies on the line segment mv. Thus, by Truth-Directed, we have that m is at least as far from v as p is. That is, D(m, v) ≥ D(p, v). Thus, (1).
  • By the definition of k, we have D(b, k) = D(b, v). A little calculation shows that, by Truth-Directed, we have D(b, k) = D(b, 2bk). Thus, we have D(b, v) = D(b, 2bk). And thus by Strong Convexity and Symmetry, it follows that D(b, •) obtains a unique minimum on the line segment v(2b-k) at ½(vk) + b. Thus, in particular, D(b, v) > D(b, ½(v - k) + b). But, again by Truth-Directed, from the definition of m we have D(b, ½(wk) + b) = D(m, v). Thus, (2).

As already noted, putting (1) and (2) together gives us Lemma 2(1).

Next, we turn to Lemma 2(2). This time we must show that no credence function in V+ is weakly dominated by any other credence function in B. In fact, we show something a little stronger. We show that, for any p in V+ and any distinct b in B, there is v in V such that G(p, v) < G(b, v). That is, by moving from a credence function in V+ to any alternative credence function, our agent will become less accurate at some world. Suppose, for a reductio, that p in V+ and b in B and, for all v in V, G(b, v) ≤ G(p, v). Thus, D(b, v) ≤ D(p, v). Then define the following subset AV+ as follows:

A := {c in V+ : D(b, c) ≤ D(p, c)}

Thus, A is the set of credence functions that are either (i) equidistant from b and p or (ii) closer to b than to p.

We will show that A is a convex set that contains all valuation functions v in V, but does not contain p. Thus, we have that A is a convex set that includes V but is a proper subset of V+. This contradicts our assumption that V+ is the convex hull of V. This gives us our conclusion.
  1. VA, by the assumption from which we are trying to derive a contradiction.
  2. pA, since by Non-Triviality, we have D(b, p) > D(p, p). Thus, AV+.
  3. A is convex, since by Dominating Compromise, we have: for all b, b′, c, c′ in B, if D(b, c) ≤ D(b′, c) and D(b, c′) ≤ D(b′, c′), then for all 0 ≤ λ ≤ 1,
    D(b, λc + (1-λ)c′) ≤ D(b′, λc + (1-λ)c′)

This gives us our contradiction from which we infer Lemma 2(2).

Copyright © 2011 by
Richard Pettigrew <Richard.Pettigrew@bris.ac.uk>

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