Supplement to Epistemic Utility Arguments for Probabilism

Proof of Theorems 8 and 9

We wish to prove the following theorems (Leitgeb and Pettigrew 2010b):

Theorem 8. Suppose L(A, v, r) = λ|v(A) − r|². Suppose bB and EF. Then the following are equivalent:
  1. For all A in F and r in ℜ,
    LExpL, E(b(A), A | b) ≤ LExpL, E(r, A | b)
  2. b is a probability function on F and b(E) = 1.

That is, only probabilistic credence functions that assign credence 1 to E expect themselves to be at least as good as they expect any other credence function to be in the light of evidence E.

Theorem 9. Suppose L(A, v, r) = λ|v(A) − r|². Suppose b, b′ in B are probability functions, E in F, and b(E) > 0. Then the following are equivalent:
  1. For all A in F and r in ℜ,
    LExpL, E(b′(A), A | b) ≤ LExpL, E(r, A | b)
  2. b′(•) = b( • | E).

That is, an initial probabilistic credence function b expects conditionalization to give the best credence function in the presence of evidence E.

We prove these two theorems together because they both depend on the following lemma. We use ΣA to denote the sum over those v in V that make proposition A true. And we use Σ to denote the sum over all v in V.

Lemma 1. Suppose L(A, v, r) = λ|v(A) − r|², bB and b(v) > 0 for some v such that v(E) = 1. Then the following two propositions are equivalent:
  1. d/dx LExpL, E(x, A | b) = 0
  2. x = [ΣA&Eb(v)] / [ΣEb(v)]

The proof is straightforward calculus:

d/dx LExpL, E(x, A b)
  =  d/dxA&E b(v)(1 − x)² + Σ¬A&Eb(v)x²]
  =  2xΣEb(v) − 2ΣA&Eb(v)
  =  0

if, and only if,

x = [ΣA&Eb(v)] / ΣEb(v)
as required.

From this lemma, Theorems 8 and 9 follow.

By Lemma 1, Theorem 8(1) holds if, and only if,

b(A) = [ΣA&Eb(v)] / [ΣEb(v)]

which can easily be verified to hold if, and only if, b is a probability function on F with b(E) = 1. That is, if, and only if, Theorem 8(2) holds.

Similarly, by Lemma 1, Theorem 9(1) holds if, and only if,

b’(A) = [ΣA&Eb(v)] / [ΣEb(v)]

for all A in F, which holds if, and only if, b’(A) = b(A | E) for all A in F. That is, if, and only if, Theorem 9(2) holds.

Copyright © 2011 by
Richard Pettigrew <Richard.Pettigrew@bris.ac.uk>

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