Supplement to Bayesian Epistemology

Dutch Book Arguments

The Ramsey/de Finetti argument can be illustrated by an example. Suppose that agent A's degrees of belief in S and ~S (written db(S) and db(~S)) are each .51, and, thus that their sum 1.02 (greater than one). On the behavioral interpretation of degrees of belief introduced above, A would be willing to pay db(S) × $1 for a unit wager on S and db(~S) × $1 for a unit wager on ~S. If a bookie B sells both wagers to A for a total of $1.02, the combination would be a synchronic Dutch Book -- synchronic because the wagers could both be entered into at the same time, and a Dutch Book because A would have paid $1.02 on a combination of wagers guaranteed to pay exactly $1. Thus, A would have a guaranteed net loss of $.02

The Lewis/Teller argument can also be illustrated by an example. Suppose that agent A's degrees of belief satisfy the synchronic probabilistic coherence conditions -- that is, the probability laws. Suppose also that A has the following initial probabilities:

Pi(S) = 1/5

Pi(T) = 1/5

Pi(S&T) = 1/10

Pi(S/T) = 1/2

A is about to learn whether or not T is true (nothing more). If A learns that T is true, the Simple Principle of Conditionalization would require A to change her probability assignment to S (Pf(S)) to equal Pi(S/T) = ½. Suppose A realizes that, if she learns that T is true, she will change her probability assignment to S to Pf(S) = 6/10 > Pi(S/T) [a parallel argument applies to the case in which A knows in advance that were she to learn that T, Pf(S) would be less than Pi(S/T)].

Initially, bookie B can make the following wagers with A:

(1) B sells A an unconditional wager that pays $.10 if T is true for Pi(T) × $.10 = 1/5 × $.10 = $.02.

(2) B buys from A a unit wager on S conditional on T for Pi(S/T) × $1 = ½ × $1 = $.50.

After it is determined whether or not T is true, there are two possibilities:

(a) T is not true.

In that case, A loses $.02 on the first wager and the second wager is called off, so no one wins or loses anything on the second wager. The result is a net loss of $.02 for A.

(b) T is true.

In that case, B makes an additional wager with A:

(3) B sells to A an unconditional unit wager on S for Pf(S) × $1 = 6/10 × $1 = $.60.

Then there are two further sub-possibilities:

(b1) S is true. A gains $.08 on wager 1 (the $.10 pay-off, less the $.02 that A paid for the wager); A loses $.50 on wager 2 (B paid A $.50 for the wager, but A must pay $1 to B); A gains $.40 on wager 3 (A paid B $.60 for the wager, but B must pay A $1). The net result of all three wagers is a $.02 loss for A.

(b2) S is not true. Again A gains $.08 on wager 1 (the $.10 pay-off, less the $.02 that A paid for the wager); A gains $.50 on wager 2 (B paid A $.50 for the wager, and A does not pay B anything); A loses $.60 on wager 3 (A paid B $.60 for the wager, and B does not pay A anything). Again the net result of all three wagers is a $.02 loss for A.

Because (a), (b1), and (b2) exhaust all the logical possibilities, the example is one in which A is guaranteed to lose $.02, no matter what happens. Because wager 3 cannot be made at the same time as wagers 1 and 2, the combination of wagers 1-3 is a diachronic Dutch Book.

Return to Bayesian Epistemology

Copyright © 2008 by
William Talbott

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free