#### Supplement to Bayesian Epistemology

## Dutch Book Arguments

The Ramsey/de Finetti argument can be illustrated by an
example. Suppose that agent *A*'s degrees of belief in
*S* and ~*S* (written *db*(*S*) and
*db*(~*S*)) are each .51, and, thus that their sum 1.02
(greater than one). On the behavioral interpretation of degrees of
belief introduced above, *A* would be willing to pay
*db*(*S*)
× $1 for a
unit wager on *S* and *db*(~*S*)
× $1 for a unit wager on ~*S*. If a bookie *B*
sells both wagers to *A* for a total of $1.02, the combination
would be a synchronic Dutch Book -- synchronic because the wagers
could both be entered into at the same time, and a Dutch Book because
*A* would have paid $1.02 on a combination of wagers guaranteed
to pay exactly $1. Thus, *A* would have a guaranteed net loss
of $.02

The Lewis/Teller argument can also be illustrated by an
example. Suppose that agent *A*'s degrees of belief
satisfy the synchronic probabilistic coherence conditions -- that is,
the probability laws. Suppose also that *A* has the following initial
probabilities:

P_{i}(S) = 1/5

P_{i}(T) = 1/5

P_{i}(S&T) = 1/10

P_{i}(S/T) = 1/2

*A*is about to learn whether or not

*T*is true (nothing more). If

*A*learns that

*T*is true, the Simple Principle of Conditionalization would require

*A*to change her probability assignment to

*S*(

*P*

_{f}(

*S*)) to equal

*P*

_{i}(

*S*/

*T*) = ½. Suppose

*A*realizes that, if she learns that

*T*is true, she will change her probability assignment to

*S*to

*P*

_{f}(

*S*) = 6/10 >

*P*

_{i}(

*S*/

*T*) [a parallel argument applies to the case in which

*A*knows in advance that were she to learn that

*T*,

*P*

_{f}(

*S*) would be less than

*P*

_{i}(

*S*/

*T*)].

Initially, bookie *B* can make the following wagers with
*A*:

(1)BsellsAan unconditional wager that pays $.10 ifTis true forP_{i}(T) × $.10 = 1/5 × $.10 = $.02.(2)

Bbuys fromAa unit wager onSconditional onTforP_{i}(S/T) × $1 = ½ × $1 = $.50.

After it is determined whether or not *T* is true, there are two
possibilities:

(a)Tis not true.

In that case, *A* loses $.02 on the first wager and the second
wager is called off, so no one wins or loses anything on the second
wager. The result is a net loss of $.02 for *A*.

(b)Tis true.

In that case, *B* makes an additional wager with *A*:

(3)Bsells toAan unconditional unit wager onSforP_{f}(S) × $1 = 6/10 × $1 = $.60.

Then there are two further sub-possibilities:

(b1)Sis true.Agains $.08 on wager 1 (the $.10 pay-off, less the $.02 thatApaid for the wager);Aloses $.50 on wager 2 (BpaidA$.50 for the wager, butAmust pay $1 toB);Agains $.40 on wager 3 (ApaidB$.60 for the wager, butBmust payA$1). The net result of all three wagers is a $.02 loss forA.(b2)

Sis not true. AgainAgains $.08 on wager 1 (the $.10 pay-off, less the $.02 thatApaid for the wager);Agains $.50 on wager 2 (BpaidA$.50 for the wager, andAdoes not payBanything);Aloses $.60 on wager 3 (ApaidB$.60 for the wager, andBdoes not payAanything). Again the net result of all three wagers is a $.02 loss forA.

Because (a), (b1), and (b2) exhaust all the logical possibilities, the
example is one in which *A* is guaranteed to lose $.02, no
matter what happens. Because wager 3 cannot be made at the same time
as wagers 1 and 2, the combination of wagers 1-3 is a diachronic Dutch
Book.