Supplement to Bayesian Epistemology

Dutch Book Arguments

The Ramsey/de Finetti argument can be illustrated by an example. Suppose that agent A's degrees of belief in S and ~S (written db(S) and db(~S)) are each .51, and, thus that their sum 1.02 (greater than one). On the behavioral interpretation of degrees of belief introduced above, A would be willing to pay db(S) × $1 for a unit wager on S and db(~S) × $1 for a unit wager on ~S. If a bookie B sells both wagers to A for a total of $1.02, the combination would be a synchronic Dutch Book -- synchronic because the wagers could both be entered into at the same time, and a Dutch Book because A would have paid $1.02 on a combination of wagers guaranteed to pay exactly $1. Thus, A would have a guaranteed net loss of $.02

The Lewis/Teller argument can also be illustrated by an example. Suppose that agent A's degrees of belief satisfy the synchronic probabilistic coherence conditions -- that is, the probability laws. Suppose also that A has the following initial probabilities:

Pi(S) = 1/5

Pi(T) = 1/5

Pi(S&T) = 1/10

Pi(S/T) = 1/2

A is about to learn whether or not T is true (nothing more). If A learns that T is true, the Simple Principle of Conditionalization would require A to change her probability assignment to S (Pf(S)) to equal Pi(S/T) = ½. Suppose A realizes that, if she learns that T is true, she will change her probability assignment to S to Pf(S) = 6/10 > Pi(S/T) [a parallel argument applies to the case in which A knows in advance that were she to learn that T, Pf(S) would be less than Pi(S/T)].

Initially, bookie B can make the following wagers with A:

(1) B sells A an unconditional wager that pays $.10 if T is true for Pi(T) × $.10 = 1/5 × $.10 = $.02.

(2) B buys from A a unit wager on S conditional on T for Pi(S/T) × $1 = ½ × $1 = $.50.

After it is determined whether or not T is true, there are two possibilities:

(a) T is not true.

In that case, A loses $.02 on the first wager and the second wager is called off, so no one wins or loses anything on the second wager. The result is a net loss of $.02 for A.

(b) T is true.

In that case, B makes an additional wager with A:

(3) B sells to A an unconditional unit wager on S for Pf(S) × $1 = 6/10 × $1 = $.60.

Then there are two further sub-possibilities:

(b1) S is true. A gains $.08 on wager 1 (the $.10 pay-off, less the $.02 that A paid for the wager); A loses $.50 on wager 2 (B paid A $.50 for the wager, but A must pay $1 to B); A gains $.40 on wager 3 (A paid B $.60 for the wager, but B must pay A $1). The net result of all three wagers is a $.02 loss for A.

(b2) S is not true. Again A gains $.08 on wager 1 (the $.10 pay-off, less the $.02 that A paid for the wager); A gains $.50 on wager 2 (B paid A $.50 for the wager, and A does not pay B anything); A loses $.60 on wager 3 (A paid B $.60 for the wager, and B does not pay A anything). Again the net result of all three wagers is a $.02 loss for A.

Because (a), (b1), and (b2) exhaust all the logical possibilities, the example is one in which A is guaranteed to lose $.02, no matter what happens. Because wager 3 cannot be made at the same time as wagers 1 and 2, the combination of wagers 1-3 is a diachronic Dutch Book.

Return to Bayesian Epistemology

Copyright © 2008 by
William Talbott

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free


The SEP would like to congratulate the National Endowment for the Humanities on its 50th anniversary and express our indebtedness for the five generous grants it awarded our project from 1997 to 2007. Readers who have benefited from the SEP are encouraged to examine the NEH’s anniversary page and, if inspired to do so, send a testimonial to neh50@neh.gov.