Notes to Computer and Information Ethics
1. In the mid 1970s, Walter Maner considered using the term “information ethics” to name the new subject in applied ethics that he was planning to teach at Old Dominion University. He decided, instead, to use the term “computer ethics” because he was creating a new course for computer science students, and he was focusing primarily upon ethical issues associated with the use of computer technology. (See Maner 1980)
In the late 1980s, Robert Hauptman began to use the term “information ethics” with a very broad meaning that could encompass many diverse kinds of ethical issues like those of interest to Wiener. Hauptman created a journal called “The Journal of Information Ethics”, though it emphasized issues of interest, especially, to librarians and journalists. (See below)
2. The term “information ethics” has been used by Luciano Floridi (see section 1.7) as a name for the rigorously developed ethical theory that he created to provide a foundation for computer ethics. In this essay, I use FIE to refer to Floridi’s specific information ethics theory to distinguish it from the much broader, and less rigorously developed, information ethics theory of Wiener. Although there are some similarities, Floridi’s theory and Wiener’s have very different goals and very different metaphysical foundations. Thus Wiener’s theory is a kind of materialism grounded in the laws of physics; while Floridi’s theory presupposes a Spinozian, perhaps even a Platonic, metaphysics (Floridi 2006). In Floridi’s theory, but not in Wiener’s, non-human entities, such as rivers, databases and stones have “rights” that ought to be respected. Floridi’s “entropy” is not the entropy of physics, as it is in Wiener; Floridi’s “information” is not the physical information of Wiener; and Floridi’s world includes non-material Platonic entities that have no place in Wiener’s universe.