Facts

First published Fri Sep 21, 2007; substantive revision Mon Jan 7, 2013

Facts, philosophers like to say, are opposed to theories and to values, they are the objects of certain mental states and acts, they make truth-bearers true and correspond to truths, they are part of the furniture of the world. We present and discuss some philosophical and formal accounts of facts.

1. Philosophies of Facts

1.1. Facts, Facts & Facts

The word “fact” is used in at least two different ways. In the locution “matters of fact,” facts are taken to be what is contingently the case, or that of which we may have empirical or a posteriori knowledge. Thus Hume famously writes at the beginning of Section IV of An Enquiry concerning Human Understanding: “All the objects of human reason or inquiry may naturally be divided into two kinds, to wit, Relations of Ideas and Matters of Fact”. The word is also used in locutions such as

It is a fact that Sam is sad
That Sam is sad is a fact
That 2 + 2 = 4 is a fact.

In this second use, the functor (operator, connective) “It is a fact that” takes a sentence to make a sentence (an alternative view has it that “It is a fact” takes a nominalised sentence, a that-clause, to make a sentence), and the predicate “is a fact” is either elliptic for the functor, or takes a nominalised sentence to make a sentence. It is locutions of this second sort that philosophers have often employed in order to claim (or deny) that facts are part of the inventory of what there is, and play an important role in semantics, ontology, metaphysics, epistemology and the philosophy of mind.

We may, then, distinguish between Humean facts and functorial facts. With the help of this distinction, two philosophical options can be formulated. One may think that there are facts in the functorial sense of the word which are contingent — the fact that Sam is sad — and facts in the functorial sense which are not contingent — the fact that 2 + 2 = 4. Or one may think that all facts in the functorial sense are contingent, are Humean matters of fact. The latter option is expounded in the influential philosophy of facts to be found in Wittgenstein's Tractatus (1921). Wittgenstein there announces that the world is the totality of facts and that every fact is contingent (Wittgenstein TLP 1.1).

The word “fact”, particularly when it is understood in the functorial sense, belongs to a family of related terms: “circumstance”, “situation (Sachlage)”, “state of affairs (Sachverhalt)”. We refer happily to the state of affairs or circumstance that Sam is sad and to the situation in which Sam is sad, although “It is a circumstance/situation that Sam is sad”, unlike “It is a fact/the case that Sam is sad”, is ill-formed.

In what follows, we distinguish three types of account of what it is to be a fact in the functorial sense and consider some possible roles for facts which have been thought to yield arguments in favour of admitting facts into our inventory of what there is. Since the category of facts is a formal category, a semantic or ontological category, we then look in some detail at different formal theories of facts and their ilk.

What might a fact be? Three popular views about the nature of facts can be distinguished:

A fact is just a true truth-bearer,

A fact is just an obtaining state of affairs,

A fact is just a sui generis type of entity in which objects exemplify properties or stand in relations.

In order to understand these claims and the relations between them it is necessary to appeal to some accounts of truth, truth-bearers, states of affairs, obtaining, objects, properties, relations and exemplification. Propositions are a popular candidate for the role of what is true or false. One view of propositions has it that these are composed exclusively of concepts, individual concepts (for example, the concept associated with the proper name “Sam”), general concepts (the concept expressed by the predicates “is sad” and “est triste”) and formal concepts (for example, the concept expressed by “or”). Concepts so understood are things we can understand. Properties and relations, we may then say, are not concepts, for they are not the sort of thing we understand. Properties are exemplified by objects and objects fall under concepts. Similarly, objects stand in relations but fall under relational concepts.

It will be convenient to understand the view that a fact is just a sui generis type of entity in which objects exemplify properties or stand in relations as relying on the way of understanding properties and relations just sketched. We shall refer to the view as the claim that facts are exemplifications. Similarly, we may understand the claim that a fact is an obtaining state of affairs to say that a state of affairs is something which contains one or more objects and at least one property or relation and that a state of affairs obtains if an object exemplifies a property or one or more objects stand in a relation. “Obtains” (German: “besteht”) belongs to the same family of predicates as “is true”. Just as it is often argued that the truth-predicate is tenseless and timeless, so it is sometimes argued or assumed that “obtains” is tenseless and timeless. A distinct question: Is “obtain” not simply a fancy way of saying “exists”? (Sundholm 1994). No, it is sometimes claimed. Obtaining is a mode of being. If a state of affairs obtains, then an obtaining state of affairs exists, a fact exists. In this respect, “obtains” resembles “endures”. Things endure. If a thing endures, then the enduring thing exists.

But it should be noted that some philosophers use “proposition” or “structured proposition” (Soames 2010) to refer to what are here called “states of affairs” and that some philosophers do not distinguish between properties and concepts. Furthermore, it should be borne in mind that in ordinary English the expression “state of affairs” is not normally used to refer to something which obtains or fails to obtain. It is used to refer to what is the case. Philosophers who talk of “states of affairs” as obtaining or failing to obtain are employing the term as a technical term, often as a translation of the German word “Sachverhalt”. Finally, states of affairs, unlike facts, are commonly said to last or endure, whereas “Sachverhalte” do not last or endure.

The two views of facts as exemplifications of properties and as obtaining states of affairs raise many metaphysical and ontological questions and are often appealed to in giving answers to metaphysical and ontological questions. They are also often appealed to in answers to questions about semantics and intentionality. Finally, facts are sometimes invoked in an area where semantics and ontology connect, the theory of truthmaking.

1.2. Facts, Ontology and Metaphysics

The metaphysical and ontological questions which are raised by the two views of facts mentioned include the following: Are the properties and relations which go to make up facts abstract (repeatable) universals or bearer-specific (non-repeatable) properties and relations (tropes)? If they are abstract universals, are these such that they are always exemplified, as friends of “Aristotelian” universals claim, or not, as friends of “Platonic” universals claim? And are they qualitative only (the property of being round) or also substantial (the property of being a man)? Are there facts containing abstract objects and properties, for example the fact that 2 is a number? Is a fact which contains a concrete object, for example the fact that Sam is sad, itself concrete or abstract? Are there facts which are formally complex, for example negative or conditional facts? What is the relation between facts, on the one hand, and concrete events, processes and states, on the other hand? Do objects stand in relations because the objects and the relations they stand in are parts of facts? What are the identity conditions for facts? Are there states of affairs which do not obtain? May such states of affairs contain non-existent objects? Are states of affairs abstract entities which exist necessarily? Do facts understood as exemplifications of properties come in two kinds — the contingently existing ones and the non-contingently existing ones? (For discussions of all these questions see the entry on states of affairs.) If concrete events, processes and states are identical with facts or can be constructed out of facts, then it is plausible to think that causality is a relation between facts. If they are not identical with facts and cannot be constructed out of facts, then it is plausible to think that causality is a relation between events and states and that causality should not be identified with causal explanations (see the entry on the metaphysics of causation, Vendler 1967, Mellor 1995, Persson 1997).

The assumption that facts contain objects, properties and relations as proper parts may be criticised (Lowe 1998, Vallicella 2002, Künne 2003). One natural mereological principle is that the proper parts of the most basic kinds of whole belong to the same general ontological category to which their wholes belong. Thus parts of things or substances are things or substances and parts of processes are processes. The view that the fact that Sam is sad contains a substance and a property offends against this principle: substances and properties belong to different kinds and neither substances nor properties, it seems, are facts. Perhaps the natural mereological principle should be rejected in favour of the view that entities of any kind may come together to form a whole. But friends of facts tend to think of facts as forming a very natural kind of whole. Another possible view is that Sam is a fact rather than part of a fact (Armstrong 1997, Johansson 2004 34, Récanati 2000, Bergmann 1967).

One ontological role for states of affairs and facts is to be the primary bearers of modality. Suppose that facts are obtaining states of affairs. Then we may distinguish the obtaining state of affairs that Sam is sad from the obtaining states of affairs that Sam is possibly sad, that Sam is probably sad, and that Sam ought to be sad. Here the modal properties qualify the property of being sad and so qualify Sam. They are de re modalities. And, so the view goes, the place of such modal properties is in states of affairs. (A state of affairs is, as the German terms “Sachverhalt”, “Sachverhältnis” suggest, a relation between things, the way things stand with respect to one another, “wie die Sachen sich zueinander verhalten”.) A further claim is that some de dicto modalities properly qualify states of affairs: the state of affairs that Sam is sad probably obtains/possibly obtains/ought to obtain. Suppose that a fact is just the exemplification of properties. Then we may distinguish the fact that Sam is a man and the fact that Sam is necessarily a man. But a friend of facts like the last one then has to accept that not all facts are formally simple.

Another possible ontological role for states of affairs and facts is to provide the terms for the tie of grounding or explanation. The fact that there is an explosion explains the fact that Sam's head turns (causal explanation). The fact that Mary slapped Sam is explained by the fact that Sam is a sexist (explanation of action by reference to an “objective” reason; Dancy 2000). The fact that Sam admires Mary is explained by the fact that she is charming (explanation of feeling by reference to an “objective” reason). The fact that there is a one-one correlation between the Fs and the Gs is explained by the fact that the number of Fs = the number of Gs (non-causal, conceptual or essential explanation). Sceptics about such claims ask what “the fact that p explains the fact that q” adds to “q because p”. (See Correia and Schnieder 2012, Mulligan 2007 and Trogdon forthcoming.)

Appeal to facts has also been made in order to give a semantics for counterfactuals (Kratzer 2002). A premise semantics for counterfactual, Kratzer argues, relies on facts: “in a premise semantics, a “would”-counterfactual is true in a world w iff every way of adding as many facts of w to the antecedent as consistency allows reaches a point where the resulting set logically implies the consequent. On the other hand, a “might”-counterfactual is true in a world w iff not every way of adding as many facts of w to the antecedent as consistency allows reaches a point where adding the consequent would result in an inconsistent set.” Those facts, she argues, have to be propositions, but they must be highly specific, almost as specific as facts conceived of as particulars (see section 1.3 below).

Finally, certain metaphysical disputes of the realism/anti-realism type are sometimes characterized in terms of facts: in such a dispute, the realist is said to countenance facts of a certain kind, whereas the anti-realist is said to reject facts of that kind. The disagreement between realists about tense (or A-theorists) and anti-realists about tense (or B-theorists), for instance, is sometimes taken to boil down to a disagreement about the question whether there are tensed facts: the former answer ‘Yes’ while the latter say ‘No’. (See e.g. Mellor 1998, Fine 2005 and Correia and Rosenkranz 2011.)

One difficulty faced by such characterizations is that of making clear what the relevant facts are supposed to be. The difficulty is particularly acute in certain debates, for instance in the debate over tense realism. For what is it for a fact to be tensed? It cannot simply be said that a tensed fact is a fact that can be referred to by means of a tensed description of type “the fact that p”, where “p” is a tensed sentence. For it is open to a B-theorist to hold that such expressions do refer to (tenseless) facts — e.g. that “the fact that Sam is lying” refers, at any time t, to a fact which can also be referred to (at any time) using the description “the fact that Sam is lying at t”. Another suggestion is that a fact is tensed if and only if it is transient, i.e. sometimes obtains and sometimes fails to obtain. Yet, it may be replied, even if the proposed characterization does capture some tensed facts, it leaves aside a number of other such facts, e.g. those which can be referred to by “the fact that Sam is currently sitting or not currently sitting” and (barring certain forms of indeterminism) “the fact that if Sam is currently sitting, then it was the case yesterday that Sam would be sitting one day hence”, respectively.

1.3. Facts and Knowledge

“Know” in instances of the locution “x knows that p” is factive: if x knows that p, then p. Similarly, “know” in instances of the locution “x knows y” is veridical: if x knows y, is acquainted with y, then there is a y and x knows y.

Is knowledge that p knowledge of facts? Is coming to know (cf. “Erkennen”) that p a form of contact with facts, where facts are understood as something other than true truth-bearers? Husserl, Russell, Vendler and Hossack (Husserl 1900–1901), Russell, Vendler 1967, 1972, Hossack 2007) reply affirmatively to one of these questions; thus Russell at one point argues that a perception has a single object, such as “knife-to-left-of-book”, an entity he first called a “complex” and then “a fact” (Russell ONTF). From Ramsey to Williamson (Ramsey 1931, Vickers 2004; Williamson 2000) many philosophers have replied negatively.

What may be said in favour of the view? Coming to know that Fa, in the simplest cases, involves acquaintance with objects and properties. Coming to know that the wall is red by seeing that it is red often involves seeing the wall. The wall is not any sort of concept. According to a popular theory in perceptual psychology, seeing that the wall is red or straight typically involves perception of a constant property, the redness or straightness of the wall, and perception of it as constant (“property constancy”, “colour constancy”, “shape constancy”). These properties are not concepts. There is thus some reason for thinking that perceptually coming to know that p, in the simplest cases, involves epistemic contact with objects and with properties. If that is right, then two components of the view that to come to know that p in such cases is to come to have knowledge of facts are plausible. But even if perceptual knowledge of facts is allowed, it is not clear why one should think that instances of “knowledge that p” or of “coming to know that p” in which the substitutions for “p” are logically complex, constitute knowledge of robust facts. Similarly, if we consider the many and various types of coming to know that p in which the source of knowledge is not sensory perception but, for example, testimony or inference, we may think that in such cases there is no reason to think that what we come to know are facts.

Kratzer's (2002) account of knowledge of facts is applied to Gettier problems (Gettier 1963, see the entry on the analysis of knowledge). She puts forward a view according to which facts are particulars which exemplify propositions (cf. Baylis 1948) — just as other particulars such as tables and persons exemplify properties. (She models these facts and propositions within Situation Semantics, as situations of a certain sort and sets of situations, respectively, but we need not go into the details here. Note that, as we saw in section 1.2 above, she also countenances facts which are propositions.) She then proposes the following analysis of knowledge:

S knows p if and only if

  1. There is a fact f that exemplifies p,
  2. S believes p de re of f, and
  3. S can rule out relevant possible alternatives of f that do not exemplify p.

It is condition (ii), Kratzer argues, which deals with Gettier cases. Take the second type of case discussed by Gettier. Smith is justified in believing the false proposition that Jones owns a Ford. Therefore he is justified in believing the proposition that Jones owns a Ford or Brown is in Barcelona. Now Brown happens to be in Barcelona, but Smith has no idea about where Brown is — in particular, he is not justified in believing that Brown is in Barcelona. Intuitively, Smith does not know the disjunctive proposition he is justified in believing. But that proposition is true, and so the standard analysis of knowledge fails. The analysis in terms of beliefs de re of facts fares better, Kratzer argues. For, she claims, the fact exemplified by the disjunctive proposition is the fact that Brown is in Barcelona, and Smith's belief is not a de re belief about that fact.

1.4. Facts, Intentionality, Semantics and Truthmaking

We have mentioned the view that facts may explain actions and mental states and the view that facts are what we know. Facts are also invoked in the philosophy of mind by philosophers who claim that judgements or beliefs enjoy the property of intentionality, of being “directed towards” something, because they represent states of affairs or are psychological relations to states of affairs and that judgements and beliefs are correct or satisfied only if states of affairs obtain, that is, if facts exist. Versions of these claims are given by many philosophers from Meinong, the early Husserl and Russell to Searle (1983). Analogous claims in semantics are sometimes made about propositions or other truth-bearers: the proposition that Sam is sad represents the state of affairs that Sam is sad and is true only if this state of affairs obtains. Versions of this view are given by Husserl, Wittgenstein and Carnap. See the

Supplementary document on the History of Philosophies of Facts.

One objection to the view that the judgement that Sam is sad represents a state of affairs is that although the judger arguably thinks of Sam and of his sadness, he may not possess any concept of a state of affairs. (Consider the analogous claim that one may judge that p without employing the concept of truth). Perhaps then a judgement represents a state of affairs but does not represent it as a state of affairs. One objection to this claim is that it commits one to the ontological view that there are states of affairs which do not obtain, the states of affairs represented by false judgements or beliefs.

If we reject the view that judgements and beliefs represent states of affairs, it is still possible to claim that judgements and beliefs have correctness conditions which mention states of affairs: if x judges correctly that p, then the state of affairs that p obtains. And if this is plausible, so too is the further claim that if x judges correctly that p, then x judges correctly that p because the state of affairs that p obtains. Facts make judgements correct.

Does the proposition that Sam is sad represent the state of affairs that Sam is sad? It may be objected that the proposition does not refer to anything as a state of affairs. And once again the friend of states of affairs may retreat to the safer claims that the proposition that Sam is sad is true only if the state of affairs that Sam is sad obtains and that if the proposition that Sam is sad is true, it is true because the state of affairs obtains. Facts make propositions true.

Facts, then, are perhaps qualified to play the role of what makes judgements correct and propositions true. But the theory of correctness and of truth does not require us to accept that there are facts. Indeed it may be thought that the requirements of such a theory are satisfied by the observations that a judgement that p is correct only if p, and that the proposition that p is true only if p. If arguments in metaphysics or epistemology persuade us that there are facts, then we may perhaps appeal to facts in giving accounts of correctness and of truth. In the case of the theory of correctness conditions for judgement and belief the argument that knowledge is of facts together with the view that, contrary to a long and influential tradition, the theory of belief and of judgement presupposes a theory of knowledge (Williamson 2000) may persuade us that facts make judgements and beliefs correct.

The view that facts make propositions or other truth-bearers true is one theory among many of truthmaking. The theory of truthmaking deals with questions at the intersection between ontology, metaphysics and semantics. The view that facts are what make truth-bearers true is the oldest theory of truthmaking. One central choice within truthmaker theory is between acceptance and rejection of truthmaker maximalism. Truthmaker maximalism is the view that every truth has a truthmaker. (It is an analogue of claims about modalities other than the modality of truth such as that every necessity is made necessary, that every probability has a probabiliser, that if something has a value there is something which makes it valuable, a “valifier” etc.) Factualist truthmaker maximalism says that every truth is made true by a fact. Factualist truthmaker maximalism comes in many shapes and sizes. It is sometimes combined with the view that propositions represent states of affairs. It is sometimes defended by friends of the view that facts are obtaining states of affairs (Pfänder 1921), sometimes by friends of the view that facts are neither true propositions nor obtaining states of affairs but exemplifications of properties (Armstrong 2004).

By far the most popular objection to factualist truthmaker maximalism, an objection made by both friends and enemies of facts, is that it is ontologically baroque, that is to say, incredible. The idea that there are negative or conditional facts, the objection goes, is incompatible with the demands of metaphysical economy or with the requirements of naturalism. By far the most popular factualist alternative to factualist truthmaker maximalism is the view that all logically atomic truths have truthmakers and that these are formally simple or atomic facts or the view that the only truthmakers which are facts are formally simple. Versions of these views are defended by the logical atomists (see the entry on the correspondence theory of truth and section 2.4.2 below).

Appeals to facts as truthmakers presuppose that there are different facts. But it has been argued that if there are any facts, there is only one Great Fact. See the

Supplementary document on the Slingshot Argument.

If this argument is sound, then theories of facts as truthmakers and as what correspond to truths as well as many other theories which rely on facts, are trivialised.

In the debate between friends and enemies of factualist truthmaker maximalism it is often assumed that truthmakers must be ontologically or metaphysically fundamental. Indeed it is sometimes argued that the theory of truthmaking is a guide to what there is and it is assumed that what there is is just what is ontologically fundamental. The assumption may be rejected. (See the entry on truthmakers.) Perhaps there are facts but facts are not ontologically fundamental. (Compare the claim that there are social entities but that these are not ontologically fundamental.) Then even atomic facts would not be ontologically fundamental. Perhaps Sam and his concrete state of sadness are ontologically fundamental and the fact that Sam is sad is not ontologically fundamental.

What might it mean to say that there are facts but they are not ontologically fundamental? Perhaps that facts or the unity of facts are determined by non-facts (Valicella 2000, Mulligan 2006a). Possible candidates for this role are truth-bearers, for example propositions, together with what is ontologically fundamental. If facts are not ontologically fundamental, then one objection to factualist truthmaker maximalism misses its mark. According to yet another view, facts are complexes made up of objects and properties and those complexes which are facts are less basic than their parts (Fine 1982) .

Any philosophy of facts owes us an account of the form of such expressions as “the fact that Sam is sad” (Lowe 1998) and “the state of affairs that Sam is sad”. (Analogous questions arise concerning the form of “the proposition that Sam is sad”, “the property of sadness”, “the concept of sadness” etc.) Friends of facts who have written at great length about facts and given the distinct impression that they are referring to facts and predicating properties of facts have nevertheless claimed that facts or situations cannot be named (Russell, Wittgenstein; cf. Clarke 1975) or that they have no properties (Ingarden). The expression “the fact that Sam is sad” looks like a definite description. What is the form of such a description? One possibility (Künne 2003 p. 10) is that it should be read as: the unique x such that x is a fact and x = that Sam is sad.

One objection to this suggestion is that clauses such as “that Sam is sad” cannot flank the identity sign. The following identity sentence, on the other hand, is perfectly well-formed and, many friends of facts claim, false:

The fact that Sam is sad = the proposition that Sam is sad

This suggests that clauses such as “that Sam is sad” can only flank the identity sign if they are governed by expressions such as “the fact”, “the proposition”, “the belief”. The suggested analysis of our definite descriptions may be motivated by the assumption that “the fact that Sam is sad” is derived by nominalising “It is a fact that Sam is sad” and the assumption that in the latter sentence “It is a fact” takes “that Sam is sad” to make a sentence.

Another account of expressions such as “the fact that Fa” builds on suggestions made by Russell in 1913 (Hochberg 2001). Let ‘T’, ‘A’ and ‘IN’ express the relations ‘is a term in’, ‘is an attribute in’ and ‘informs’, respectively. These relations are the formal ontological relations between atomic facts, on the one hand, and their terms (objects), attributes (properties) and forms, on the other hand. Then the structure of “the fact that Fa exists” is:

E![ιf(T(a, f) & A(F, f) & INx, f))]

That is, the fact that contains a as a term and F as an attribute and that is of the form φx exists. It has also been argued that what underlies talk about an object exemplifying a property is just the relations of being a term in a fact and being an attribute in a fact (Sprigge 1970).

How do expressions such as “the state of affairs that Sam is sad” relate to their referents? One view is that they are rigid designators. (For discussion of this question in connection with related cases such as instances of “the property of being F” and “the proposition that p”, see Schnieder 2005, Yagiwasa 1997, Tye 1981).

2. Formal Theories of Facts

Formal studies of facts are scarce. And they are also heterogeneous, both in form and in content. In form insofar as they are formulated in languages of various kinds, which vary greatly in expressive power. And in content, not only because of the variety of views on given issues, but also because the kind of issues dealt with varies greatly. This makes it difficult to present these theories within a uniform framework. We are going to choose a specific framework, present, within that framework, (some of) the options a fact-theorist may wish to adopt, study their relationships, and give references in due course to indicate where in the resulting space of possible theories various accounts, formal and non-formal, are to be located. Our framework is significantly distinct from many of those which are used in the literature. So it should be kept in mind that in attributing this or that view to an author, what we will say is often not to be understood literally: when it is not, what we really attribute to the author is something which, translated into our framework, is what we literally attribute to her.

There are two main uses of the predicate ‘is a fact’. On one of them, the predicate is rigid (necessarily, if something is a fact, then it cannot fail to be a fact). On that use, and given the assumption that there are contingent facts, it is possible that something be a fact without existing (obtaining). On the second use, nothing can be a fact unless it exists, and so on the assumption that there are contingent facts, the predicate is non-rigid. Some call facts in the first sense states of affairs or situations, reserving the word ‘fact’ to mean what ‘obtaining state of affairs’ or ‘actual situation’ mean. Throughout this section we shall use ‘fact’ in the first sense.

The issues we are going to deal with fall under the following five headings: Facts and Worlds, Boolean Operations on Facts, Independency, Facts and Propositions, The Inner Structure of Facts. The presentation will be cumulative in character: in each section we will come back to topics dealt with in previous ones (if any), sometimes in order to compare the current options available to a fact-theorist to the old ones.

2.1. Facts and Worlds

Many metaphysicians are interested in the modal sphere. They do not only want to determine which entities there actually are and their actual properties. They wish to formulate claims with modal content, they want to determine which entities there can or must be, and which are their properties across all (metaphysically) possible worlds.

In this section we deal with some basic modal issues related to facts. More precisely, we shall present and compare certain principles involving facts and (possible) worlds. Although at some places we shall mention the view that worlds are themselves facts, or sets or pluralities or sums of facts, we shall remain neutral as to the nature of worlds.

Let W be the set of all possible worlds, F the function which assigns to each world w the set Fw of facts which exist in it, and F the union of all the Fws, i.e. the set of all facts. We assume that W has infinitely many members. This is a reasonable assumption, which will have some importance in what follows with respect to certain entailment claims we are going to make (not having the assumption would force us to distinguish cases). Since we are dealing with theories of facts, we shall also assume that F is non-empty. Although perhaps there are impossible states of affairs or situations, we take it that there are no impossible facts. That is why there is no room for them in our framework.

Where x is a fact, es(x) (the existence-set of x) is the set of all worlds at which x exists. And where G is a set of facts, ces(G) (the conjunctive-existence-set of G) is ∩xG es(x), i.e. the set of worlds at which all elements of G exist, and des(G) (the disjunctive-existence-set of G) is ∪xG es(x), i.e. the set of worlds at which some elements of G exist. Notice that ces(∅) = W, des(∅) = ∅, and that given any G ≠ ∅, ces(G) ⊆ des(G). (Here and elsewhere, we borrow some vocabulary and symbolism from Fine 1982.)

2.1.1. Some Characterization Principles

We shall say that a set of facts G characterizes a set of worlds V iff ces(G) = V, and that a fact x characterizes a set of worlds V iff es(x) = V (no confusion should arise from the ambiguity of ‘characterize’). At this very early point some work can already be done.

We assume the following definitions:

  • F# = the set of all contingent facts (i.e. of all facts whose existence-set is not W);
  • P(F) = the set of all sets of facts;
  • P(F)* = the set of all non-empty sets of facts;
  • π(F) = the set of all sets of facts G with G ≠ ∅ and ces(G) ≠ ∅.

Of special interest are the following boolean principles (‘\’ refers to the operation of set-theoretic substraction):

B1. If xF#, then some fact characterizes W \ es(x);
B2. If G∈π(F), then some fact characterizes ces(G);
B3. If GP(F)*, some fact characterizes des(G);
B4. Some fact characterizes W.

If facts can be negated, then the negation of fact x (if any) will have existence-set W \ es(x). If facts can be conjoined, then the conjunction of the facts in set G (if any) will have existence-set ces(G). And if facts can be disjoined, then the disjunction of the facts in set G (if any) will have existence-set des(G). One can then understand why we call these principles ‘boolean’.

B1 and B3 together entail B4. Assuming B1 and B4, B2 is equivalent to B3. Notice that if it is assumed that every world contains at least one fact (a principle we shall call ‘Plenitude’), then B3 implies B4 (take G = F). Also notice that both B1 and B4 entail Plenitude. See Figure 1.

figure 1 - B diagram

Figure 1.

It is tempting to adopt the principle:

No Twins. Worlds with the very same facts (twins, for short) are identical, i.e. Fw = Fv implies w = v, i.e. F is injective.

Another formulation of No Twins might be the following: the identity of a world is completely determined by which facts hold in it. No Twins imposes serious constraints on the cardinality of F. In particular, since there are infinitely many worlds, No Twins implies that there must also be infinitely many facts.

The B-principles assert the existence of facts characterising various sets of worlds. Similar principles of special interest are of the same vein:

W1. Every world-singleton is characterized by some non-empty set of facts;
W2. Every world-singleton is characterized by some fact;
W3. Every non-empty set of worlds is characterized by some non-empty set of facts;
W4. Every non-empty set of worlds is characterized by some fact.

The W-principles have mates of a certain interest:

W1′. Every singleton* is characterized by some non-empty set of facts;
W2′. Every singleton* is characterized by some fact;
W3′. Every non-empty set* is characterized by some non-empty set of facts;
W4′. Every non-empty set* is characterized by some fact.

A set* is a set of worlds which contains all twins of its members (∅ and W are then sets*), and a singleton* is a set* whose members are all twins. Notice that all existence-sets, conjunctive existence-sets and disjunctive existence-sets, as well as their complements in W, are sets*.

W4 entails both W2 and W3, and in turn each of them entails W1. All the same, W4′ entails both W2′ and W3′, and in turn each of them entails W1′. No Twins is a consequence of W1. Under the assumption that No Twins is true, each Wi is equivalent to Wi′. So each Wi entails Wi′. W4′ entails all the Bs. W1′ entails Plenitude. W4 is thus an extremely strong principle, since it entails all the principles we have met so far. See Figure 2.

figure 2 - W diagram

Figure 2.

W4′ is equivalent to B2 + W3′, W2′ plus B3 yields W4′, W1′ plus B2 yields W2′. B1 yields W1′. See Figure 3.

figure 3 - B+W diagram

Figure 3.

All the previous principles are compatible with there being distinct facts existing at exactly the very same worlds. One may wish to deny that this is possible, and adopt:

Modal Criterion. Two facts are identical if they have the same existence-set, i.e. x = y whenever es(x) = es(y).

This provides a modal criterion for the identity of facts. If Modal Criterion is accepted, each B-principle is equivalent to the result of replacing in the principle ‘some fact’ by ‘a unique fact’. The same holds of W2, W2′, W4 and W4′.

Modal Criterion is controversial. One may wish to claim that there are such things as the fact that Socrates exists, the fact that Socrates exists and every number is a number, and the fact that singleton {Socrates} exists, and that all or some of these facts are distinct. But given plausible assumptions about the existence-conditions of these facts, they all have the same existence-set.

Modal Criterion holds in the views put forward in Wittgenstein TLP, Suszko 1968 and Fine 1982 (in theories F(A)-Cond and C-Cond). It does not hold in Fine's theory F-Cond (Fine 1982) and Zalta's theory (Zalta 1991), under the two interpretations indeed. References relative to previous principles will be given later on. More detail is available in the

Supplementary document on Some Formal Theories in the Literature.

2.1.2. Facts as Sets of Worlds, Worlds as Facts, Worlds as Sets (or Pluralities, or Sums) of Facts

There is a view according to which propositions are sets of worlds. One might prefer to identify facts with sets of worlds (this is what is done in Restall 2004). On this view, for every fact x, es(x) = x, and for every world w, Fw = {x : xF and wx}. Modal Criterion is then satisfied. Suppose that all non-empty sets of worlds are facts. This is a very natural option for the view under consideration, and is actually countenanced by Restall. Then the strong W4 is satisfied.

On a dual view, worlds are taken to be sets of facts, a world being identified with its own domain: for every world w, Fw = w. On that view, No Twins is trivially true. Variants on that view take worlds to be pluralities, or mereological sums of facts. Cresswell (Cresswell 1972) is in the set camp, Wittgenstein (TLP), it seems, in the plurality camp.

Still another view is that worlds are themselves facts (Suszko 1968, Plantinga 1974 and Zalta 1991). A natural claim, on that view, is that each world belongs to its own domain and to it only, i.e. that for every world w, es(w) = {w}. If this is accepted, No Twins and W2 are true.

Here is a simple theory which goes in that direction (Wolniewicz 1982). Let us take the notion of a fact containing another fact as a primitive. We shall use ‘xy’ for ‘x is contained in y’, and we shall take relation ≤ to be reflexive, antisymmetric and transitive. One option is to define fact containment in modal terms (i.e. define ‘xy’ as ‘necessarily, x exists if y does’), but we shall remain neutral on this issue.

Let us define a world as a maximal fact under the relation of fact-containment: x is a world iff for every fact y, if xy, then x = y. We assume that every fact is contained in some world.

We then define the domain Fw of world w to be the set of all facts w contains. Thus the union of all the domains is the set of all facts. Clearly, each world belongs to its own domain and to it only: es(w) = {w}. So (as we previously pointed out) No Twins and W2 hold, and Modal Criterion is ensured if we accept the principle according to which two facts are identical provided that they are contained in the very same worlds.

2.2. Boolean Operations on Facts

Propositions can be negated, conjoined and disjoined to other propositions. As we previously saw, there is an issue as to whether the same holds of facts. In this section we introduce the boolean operations on facts, and point to the four main views as to which of these operations actually exist.

An operation of negation on facts is a function  ·n which satisfies the following axioms:

N1.  ·n is a total function from F# to F#;
N2. If x = yn, then es(x) = W \ es(y);
N3. xnn = x.

The existence of a negation operation ensures the truth of B1. In turn, the existence of an operation of negation is ensured if Modal Criterion and B1 are accepted—in particular under the view which takes facts to be sets of worlds; in that case, set-complementation is a negation operation.

An operation of conjunction on facts is a function  ·c which obeys the following principles:

C1.  ·c is a total function from π(F) to F;
C2. If x = Gc, then es(x) = ces(G) (for G∈π(F));
C3. {x}c = x;
C4. (∪KG K)c = (∪KG {Kc})c (for ∪KG K∈π(F)).

The existence of a negation operation ensures the truth of B2. In turn, the existence of an operation of conjunction is ensured if Modal Criterion and B2 are accepted — in particular under the view of facts as sets of worlds; in that case, intersection is a conjunction operation.

Finally, an operation of disjunction on facts is a function  ·d which has the following properties:

D1.  ·d is a total function from P(F)* to F;
D2. If x = Gd, then es(x) = des(G) (for GP(F)*);
D3. {x}d = x;
D4. (∪KG K)d = (∪KG {Kd})d (for ∪KG KP(F)*).

The existence of a negation operation ensures the truth of B3. In turn, the existence of an operation of disjunction is ensured if Modal Criterion and B3 are accepted — in particular under the view of facts as sets of worlds; in that case, union is a disjunction operation.

Suppose all three operations are accepted (in which case all the Bs are true). It is then possible to define an operation in terms of negation and conjunction which behaves almost exactly like disjunction. Let ρ(F) be the set of all sets of facts G with G ≠ ∅ and des(G) ≠ W. Where H is any set of facts, we let nH be {xn : xHF#}, the negative image of H. This disjunction-like operation,  ·δ, is a (total) function from ρ(F) to F# defined by the following condition: Gδ = (nG)cn.  ·δ behaves like disjunction in that it satisfies the principles resulting from replacing ‘P(F)*’ by ‘ρ(F)’ in D1-D4.

Some extra principles must then presumably be introduced, as we presumably want d and δ to coincide on ρ(F). We may just adopt the principle which says this:

D5. If G∈ρ(F), then Gd = Gδ.

Here is a table indicating, for some theories, which operations they allow (+ means acceptance and rejection):

negation conjunction disjunction
Armstrong 1997    +  
Fine 1982 *  + for theory F(A)-Cond
  for theory C-Cond
 + for F(A)-Cond
 + for C-Cond
 + for F(A)-Cond
  for C-Cond
Restall 2004  +  +  +
Russell PLA neither + nor    
Suszko 1968 *  +  + restricted to finite collections of facts  + restricted to finite collections of facts
Taylor 1985  +  + restricted to finite collections of facts  + restricted to finite collections of facts
Van Fraassen 1969 (modalized version) *  + for a distinguished class of “atomic” facts only  +  
Wittgenstein TLP      
Zalta 1991 first interpretation *  +  + restricted to finite collections of facts  + restricted to finite collections of facts
Zalta 1991 second interpretation *    + restricted to finite collections of facts  

(On the entries containing a *, see the supplementary document Some Formal Theories in the Literature.) In the case of Restall, commitment to all three operations directly follows from the fact that his theory validates W4 and Modal Criterion. Taylor in fact has no modal theory of facts, but it seems that in a natural modal extension of his theory the previously mentioned acceptance claims should be correct. The restrictions in Taylor's case are due to the fact that he works with standard first-order languages. Taylor is concerned with giving a theory of the facts “posited” by standard first-order languages, i.e. of the facts which play a role in determining the truth-values of the sentences of that language. Standard first-order languages admit of conjunction and disjunction only on finite collections of sentences, hence the restrictions relative to facts. But clearly, moving to languages in which infinite conjunctions and disjunctions are freely allowed, the restrictions would vanish.

In the light of the previous table, there are four main views as to which boolean operations are to be accepted:

τ1: No boolean operation on facts.
τ2: Only negation on a distinguished class of “atomic” facts, and conjunction.
τ3: Only conjunction.
τ4: All boolean operations.

(The restrictions for conjunction and disjunction indicated in the table are due to accidental limitations in expressive power, as we pointed out for the case of Taylor, and point out for the other cases in the supplementary document Some Formal Theories in the Literature.)

2.3. Independency

Say that a set of facts G is independent iff G is not empty and any of its subsets H is such that there is a domain Fw such that such that GFw = H. That G is independent means (i) that any collection of facts in G may obtain together without any other fact in G obtaining, and (ii) that no fact in G need obtain.

Let n, c, d be boolean operations, of negation, conjunction and disjunction, respectively. Where G is any set of facts, we put:

  • nG =df {xn : xGF#} (the negative image of G);
  • cG =df {Hc : HG, H∈π(F)} (the conjunctive closure of G);
  • dG =df {Hd : GH ≠ ∅, HP(F)*}(the disjunctive closure of G);
  • G is consistent iff for every fact x in F#, not both xG and xnG;
  • G is maximal iff ¬(xG) implies x in F# and xnG.
  • G is conjunctively complete iff for every set of facts H in π(F), HcG iff HG.

Each world-domain is maximal consistent. Maximal consistency entails conjunctive closure, so each world-domain is maximal consistent. A maximal set of facts contains all non-contingent facts (if any), and is never empty.

Where G and H are any set of facts, we shall say that:

  • H generates G via conjunction iff G = cH;
  • H generates G via booleanization iff G = dc(HnH).

Notice that dc(HnH) is the smallest set of facts containing H closed under the boolean operations.

Suppose there is an independent set H. Then if H = F or H generates F via conjunction, then all facts are contingent. Moreover, Modal Criterion holds if H = F or generates F via conjunction or booleanization.

We shall now consider three particular theories of facts involving the notions of independence and generation:

T1: τ1 + ‘F is independent’;
T3: τ3 + ‘F is generated by an independent set via conjunction’;
T4: τ4 + ‘F is generated by an independent set via booleanization’.

Let φ be the function which associates to each singleton* the common domain of its members. Consider now the following principles:

Co1. φ is a bijection from the set of all singletons* onto the set of all sets of facts;
Co3. φ is a bijection from the set of all singletons* onto the set of all conjunctively complete sets of facts;
Co4. φ is a bijection from the set of all singletons* onto the set of all maximal consistent sets of facts.

For i = 1, 3 or 4, Ti entails Coi. If No Twins is added to each theory, each Ti entails the principle which results from replacing ‘φ’ by ‘F’ and ‘the set of all singletons' by ‘W’ in Coi:

CO1. F is a bijection from W onto the set of all sets of facts;
CO3. F is a bijection from W onto the set of all conjunctively complete sets of facts;
CO4. F is a bijection from W onto the set of all maximal consistent sets of facts.

Some properties of our theories are depicted in the following tableaux, where ‘+’ means ‘holds’, ‘−’ means ‘fails to hold’ and ‘?’ means ‘indeterminate’.

B1 B2 B3 B4 W1 W2 W3 W4 W1′ W2′ W3′ W4′ Plenitude No Twins Modal Criterion
T1 ? +
T3 + ? +
T4 + + + + ? ? ? ? + + + + + ? +

In the presence of No Twins, T4 entails all the Ws.

T1 is a component of Wittgenstein's logical atomism in Wittgenstein TLP. It also appears in Cresswell 1972. Suszko 1968 has something very close to T4 (Cf. the supplementary document Some Formal Theories in the Literature).

Armstrong (Armstrong 1997) works with a different notion of independency, which we may call independency*. A set of facts is independent* iff given any of it subsets G and any of its member x not in G, it is possible that the members of G exist without x, and it is also possible that they exist with x. Independency is strictly stronger than independency*: The independency*, but not the independency, of a set is compatible with there being a member of that set existing in every world (not the same member each time, of course). Armstrong expresses the hope that the set of atomic facts he countenances is independent*, though he recognizes that there may be difficulties to defend the view. We do not know whether he would express the hope that the set of atomic facts he countenances is independent tout court. Anyway, even if he held the view he would not endorse T3, since he recognizes “totality facts” (Cf. section 2.4.2), which are not conjunctions of atomic facts.

2.4. Facts and Propositions

As we pointed out above, one view about facts is that to be a fact is to be a true proposition. On another, incompatible view, facts are what make true propositions true, or more generally, account for their truth. The search for what accounts for the truth of propositions is, as we have seen, actually one main rationale for the introduction of facts. In what follows we shall deal with the two views.

By ‘proposition’, we shall mean truth-bearer, and remain neutral as to whether truth-bearers are sentences, statements, beliefs or abstract objects expressed by sentences, for instance—except in section 2.4.1.

Each world w has its set Tw of true propositions, and we call ts(p) (the truth-set of p) the set of all worlds at which p is true. Where p is a proposition, let es(p) (the existence-set of p) be the set of all worlds at which it exists.

2.4.1. Facts as True Propositions

Let us consider here the view that to be a fact is to be a true proposition. On such a view, propositions cannot be sentences or statements or beliefs. They are, perhaps, abstract entities expressed or designated by sentences.

There is an issue as to what the existence-conditions for propositions (taken in that sense, the qualification will be constant in this section) are, which is relevant for the view under consideration. On one view, propositions exist necessarily, i.e. the existence-set of any proposition is W, the set of all possible worlds. On another view, the existence of a proposition is in general world-relative.

The world-relative view comes in several variants. Two such variants which will be of central interest to us correspond to the two possible answers to the question ‘Can a proposition be true without existing?’. The view that a proposition can be true without existing is quite plausible under the assumption that propositions expressed by sentences which contain proper names are composite objects which literally contain the individuals denoted by these names. For it is plausible to maintain that no whole can exist without its parts, and if this and the previously mentioned assumption are true, then the proposition expressed by ‘Socrates is not a philosopher’ will turn out true in worlds where it does not exist (it is assumed here that there can be no non-existent philosopher, and that Socrates is not a necessary existent). (Against this line of thought, see the discussion of New Actualism in the entry on actualism.)

There is a conception of propositions according to which they are sets of worlds (see e.g. Stalnaker 1976). On such a conception, the truth-set of a proposition is the proposition itself, and issues about propositional existence remain: it may be held that propositions exist necessarily, or that their existence is in general world-relative. The first option seems intrinsically the most natural, and a proponent of the world-relative view will most naturally identify the existence-set of a proposition with its truth-set—or so it seems.

Where w is a world, let Pw be the set of propositions which exists in it, and let P be ∪wW Pw, the set of all propositions. On the view that to be a fact is to be a true proposition, the set of facts which exist in world w is the set of all propositions which exist and are true at w, i.e. Fw = TwPw, and the existence-set of a fact x is es(x) ∩ ts(x). (There is a similar view according to which all facts are true propositions, while some true propositions—say, the complex ones—may not be facts, but we leave it aside.) Of course, under the assumption that no proposition can be true without existing, in particular under the assumption that they exist necessarily, for every world w, Fw = Tw, and the existence-set of a fact x is ts(x).

Suppose that propositions exist necessarily. It is plausible to say that propositions can be freely negated, conjoined and disjoined to other propositions. On that view, there are operations of negation, conjunction and disjunction of facts which obey the principles we previously introduced. The resulting view is thus extremely strong. If not all propositions exist necessarily, then questions related to the boolean operations receive answers which may vary according to the existence-conditions which are imposed on propositions.

2.4.2. Making True

As we have emphasized, one of the main rationale for introducing facts has been to account for the truth of true propositions. The idea is that whenever a proposition is true, its truth is to be explained in terms of the existence and / or non-existence of some facts.

A minimal requirement one may wish to impose in that direction is the following:

Supervenience. Fw = Fv implies Tw = Tv.

This says that truth supervenes on facts: no difference in truth without a difference in facts.

Supervenience is a direct consequence of No Twins, but one may wish to leave open the possibility of distinct worlds containing the same facts. (On the view that to be a fact is to be a true proposition, Supervenience trivially holds if it is assumed that no proposition can be true if it does not exist. If that assumption is dropped, then there is room for Supervenience to fail. That might be taken to be an argument for keeping the assumption on the view under consideration.)

Let us say that a property φ is a fact-condition iff it is a binary relation connecting sets of sets of facts and worlds, such that given any set of sets of facts Γ and any worlds w and v, if Fw = Fv, then φ(Γ,w) iff φ(Γ,v) (i.e. the holding of the condition supervenes on which facts there are). The following principle better captures the idea that facts account for the truth of true propositions:

Determination. For every proposition p and every world w at which it is true, there exists a fact-condition φ and a set Γ of sets of facts such that
  1. φ(Γ,w), and
  2. for every world v such that φ(Γ,v), p is true at v.

Determination clearly entails Supervenience.

Let us examine some stronger principles. Let us say that some given facts (jointly) necessitate proposition p iff p is true in every world where they all exist. The facts in set G (jointly) necessitate p iff ces(G) ⊆ ts(p). Let us also say that some given facts (jointly) make true proposition p in world w iff they all exist in w and they necessitate the proposition. Let us finally say that proposition p represents some given facts iff in every world where p is true, some of them exist. Proposition p represents the facts in G iff ts(p) ⊆ des(G).

Our definition of truthmaking fails to capture the explanatory character of the notion people have usually in mind when they talk about truthmaking. If something makes a given proposition true, it is usually assumed, then the existence of that thing explains the truth of the proposition. Now it should be clear that truthmaking as we have defined it is not explanatory in this sense. For everything whatsoever is a truthmaker (in our sense) for any necessary proposition, while arguably, the obtaining of the fact that Philipp lives in Geneva fails to explain the truth of your favourite tautology. Or again, consider Socrates and its singleton-set, {Socrates}. It may be argued, as we previously stressed, that granted that there are such things as the fact that Socrates exists and the fact that {Socrates} exists, these two facts obtain in exactly the same worlds. Assume this is the case. Now some may be happy with the view that the fact that Socrates exists is a truthmaker (in the usual sense) for the proposition that Socrates exists—and so with the view that the obtaining of the fact explains the truth of the proposition, but the view that the truth of that proposition is explained by the obtaining of the fact that the singleton exists is highly implausible. Yet if the fact that Socrates exists is a truthmaker (in our sense) for the proposition that Socrates exists, then the fact that the singleton exists is also a truthmaker (in our sense) for that proposition.

Representation, as we have defined it, is also quite remote from what people usually have in mind when they speak of propositions representing facts: propositions which cannot be true represent (in our sense) any fact whatsoever, and if the proposition that Socrates exists represents (in our sense) the fact that Socrates exists, then it also represents (in our sense) the fact that {Socrates} exists (granted that these two facts exist at the same worlds).

Despite the fact that truthmaking as defined above does not to capture the usual concept of making true, we shall not deal with the latter concept here. And we shall not deal either with the usual notion of representation.

Let us now turn to the stronger principles. A very strong principle connecting propositions and facts says that for every proposition p which can be true, there exists a fact represented by p which necessitates p (i.e., a fact which makes the proposition true in every world where it is true). The principle just says that for every proposition which can be true, there is a fact whose existence-set is identical to the proposition's truth-set:

P1. ∀pP° ∃xF es(x) = ts(p).

(P° is the set of all propositions which can be true.)

This is a very strong principle. Under reasonable assumptions, P1 entails the strong principle W4. For instance, this is so under the assumption that every set of worlds is the truth-set of some proposition. This assumption trivially holds if sets of worlds are taken to be propositions, but such an assumption is not needed. For let V be any set of worlds. Assume that No Twins is true. To each world w associate the conjunction cw of all propositions true in w (we suppose it exists), and consider the disjunction dV of all cw, wV (we suppose it exists). Then ts(dV) = V.

Theory F(A)-Cond described in Fine 1982 licences P1, as well as the theory put forward in Zalta 1991 (Cf. the supplementary document Some Formal Theories in the Literature). As we saw, Taylor (Taylor 1985) has no modal theory of facts, but it seems that in a natural modal extension of his theory, P1 should hold. Notice that P1 is immediate on the view that facts are sets of worlds, and that all non-empty sets of worlds are facts (the view put forward in Restall 2004). For then, es(x) = x for any fact x.

P1 might be accepted by a proponent of theory T4. Consider the following assumptions (H0 is a selected independent set which generates F via booleanization):

  1. All propositions are boolean compounds of propositions taken from a special set, the set of atomic propositions;
  2. To each atomic proposition p corresponds a fact x in H0 such that es(x) = ts(p).

A friend of T4 may be willing to accept them, and doing so he will thereby endorse P1.

There is a simpler argument against P1 enemies of disjunctive facts may advance. Take any two propositions p and q and assume they have a disjunction r (we may assume that p can be true and q false, and vice versa). By P1, there are facts x, y and z such that es(x) = ts(p) and es(y) = ts(q) and es(z) = ts(r). So es(z) = es(x) ∪ es(y), and z behaves like a disjunctive fact: it exists in a world iff x or y does.

Those who take these to be problems may endorse the following weaker principle: for every proposition p which can be true and every world w at which it is true, there is a fact which makes it true. That principle is equivalent to: for every proposition p which can be true, there exists a set of facts G whose members are represented by p such that every member of G necessitates p. To put it differently, for every proposition which can be true, there is set of facts whose disjunctive existence-set is identical to the proposition's truth-set:

P2. ∀pP° ∃GF des(G) = ts(p).

This principle is endorsed by Armstrong (Armstrong 1997), and seems to be taken by Fine as fitting his theory C-Cond (Fine 1982; Cf. the supplementary document Some Formal Theories in the Literature).

But there are still potential problems, this time related to conjunction.

For take the conjunctive proposition that Socrates is a philosopher and Frege is human. P2 tells us that there is a set of facts K such that des(K) is the truth-set of that proposition. What is that set of facts? One may be tempted to answer: the set whose sole member is the fact that Socrates is a philosopher and Frege is human. It is hard to see which other answer could be provided, and so P2 seems to commit one to conjunctive facts.

Those who are bothered by these features of P1 and P2 may wish to adopt the following principle: there is a special set of propositions Q such that (i) the restriction of P1 to Q holds, i.e. for every p in Q, there is a fact x such that es(x) = ts(p), and (ii) for every world w where a proposition p is true, there is a part R of Q whose members are true, and such that in every world where they are true, p is true.

But there are still potential problems, which actually affect P2 as well, this time related to negation. Take the negative proposition that Socrates is not a philosopher. By P2, there is a set of facts K such that des(K) is the truth-set of that proposition. What is that set of facts? One may wish to answer: the set whose sole member is the fact that Socrates is not a philosopher. Again, it is hard to think of any alternative, and so P2 seems to commit one to negative facts. Alternatively, assume the previous principle. Shall we take the proposition that Socrates is not a philosopher to be in Q or not? If we do, then we are in the same situation as before: we seem to be committed to negative facts. If we do not, it is hard to see which set of propositions RQ satisfying condition (ii) above we are going to choose.

In order to deal with negative propositions, Armstrong (Armstrong 1997) invokes a certain kind of facts which he calls ‘totality facts', facts which can be designated by means of expressions of type ‘the fact that X are all the Fs that there are’, where ‘X’ is a rigid plural designator and ‘F’ a predicate. The proposition that Socrates is not a philosopher is made true, on his view, by the fact that the atomic facts which actually obtain are all the atomic facts there are—a totality fact.

Those who are reluctant to admit disjunctive, conjunctive, negative and totality facts may wish to adopt the following principle (weaker than P2):

P3. ∀pP° ∃GP(FP(F) ∪<G,H> ∈G (ces(G) ∩ (W \ des(H))) = ts(p).

P3 says that the following is true of every proposition p which can be true: for every world where p is true, there are two sets of facts G and H such that (i) in w, all members of G exist and none of H do, and (ii) in every world where this is the case, p is true. That principle is rather ugly, but it does what it should do.

P3 might be accepted by a proponent of theory T1. Consider the following assumptions:

  1. All propositions are boolean compounds of propositions taken from a special set, the set of atomic propositions;
  2. To each atomic proposition p corresponds a fact x in F such that es(x) = ts(p).

A friend of T1 may be willing to accept them—Wittgenstein (TLP) does— and if he does, he will thereby accept P3.

Even the weak principle P3 faces some difficulties. Consider a true universal proposition, say the proposition that every finger of my right hand is less than 1m long. It seems that unless some controversial assumptions are made (like Wittgenstein's view that universal propositions are conjunctions), to countenance P3 involves accepting that there is something like the fact that every finger of my right hand is less than 1m long and claiming that its existence-set is identical to the truth-set of the proposition in question. Following Wittgenstein (TLP), many reject such universal facts. In the other camp are e.g. Russell (PLA) and Armstrong (Armstrong 1997) (Armstrong invokes certain totality facts, which have indeed a universal component.).

There is an alternative approach which escapes all the previous difficulties. The idea is that facts make true certain basic propositions, and the truth-value of the remaining, more complex propositions is determined by the basic truths and the particular content of these propositions. This is the view put forward in Wittgenstein TLP: the atomic facts make true the true atomic propositions, and whether a complex proposition (for him, a boolean combination of atomic propositions) is completely settled by what happens at the atomic level. Views of that kind are rather attractive, since they tend to favour parsimonious ontologies of facts. But they prove especially difficult to develop, especially when special propositions are taken into account, e.g. propositions involving modal concepts.

2.5. The Inner Structure of Facts

There is, as we have seen, an issue as to whether facts are complex entities or not, and as to how (if at all) the various facts are composed and as to what composition means here. (This question is not always independent of the question whether propositions are complex. This is obvious if facts are taken to be true propositions. But even if the identification is rejected, it may nevertheless be maintained that facts share important features with propositions. On propositional complexity, see the entries on singular propositions and structured propositions.)

The view that there is an operation of negation, or conjunction, or disjunction on facts is compatible with the claim that some facts are complex. For on a natural view, a conjunctive fact is literally composed by the facts of which it is a conjunction—and similarly for negation and disjunction. (Notice that admitting any two of the boolean operations would then force one to accept that there are several ways in which the very same facts can combine in order to make up a fact.) Acceptance of some boolean operations on facts is compatible with taking facts to be complex, but it does not entail it: one may accept, e.g., that a given fact is the conjunction of other facts, and at the same time believe, say, that its depends for its identity on them without having them as parts.

The issue of the complexity of facts also arises independently of issues of boolean composition. It is a widespread view among the friends of facts that certain facts are complex entities made up of objects and properties or relations, and correspond to certain simple predications, at least in the sense that in every world, the predication is true if the fact obtains. Call such facts substantial facts, and that view Substantialism. We may designate the substantial fact that objects a1, …, an stand in relation R (in that order) by ‘[R; a1, …, an]’. According to Substantialism, the sentence ‘Socrates is mortal’ corresponds in the previous sense to a certain fact composed of Socrates and of the property of being mortal, namely [being mortal; Socrates], which obtains in a world only if in that world, Socrates exemplify the property of being mortal. (There may easily be disagreement about this very example, as indeed with any particular example.) Substantialism is a form of what Fine calls ‘objectualism’ (Fine 1982). Substantialist views are put forward in Russell PLA, Suszko 1968, Van Fraassen 1969, Taylor 1985, Armstrong 1997, and perhaps Wittgenstein TLP (‘perhaps’, because it is not clear which kinds of objects compose facts according to him).

The existence-conditions of a whole often depend upon facts about its parts. If there are disjunctive / conjunctive facts which contain the corresponding disjuncts / conjuncts, then any such fact exists in a world iff some disjuncts / all the conjuncts do. And if there is a negative fact containing the corresponding negated item, the former fact exists in a world iff the latter does not. These existence-conditions are written into the nature of the boolean operations.

When we come to substantial facts, things are not so straightforward. A comparison with sets may be useful. There is a view according to which the existence of a set requires that of its members: in a world where, say, Socrates exists but not Plato, the set {Socrates, Plato} does not exist. And there is the more liberal view which says that every set exists necessarily. Corresponding to these two positions are the following two views about facts:

  1. A substantial fact exists in a world iff in that world (i) the objects have that property and (ii) the objects and the property exist;
  2. A substantial fact exists in a world iff in that world the objects have that property.

The two views are identical if no objects can have a property unless the objects and the property exist. Otherwise they are distinct. Suppose there is such a thing as the fact [being human; Socrates]. Both views can countenance such an object. But for the first the fact will exist only in worlds where Socrates exists, while for the second it is sufficient that Socrates has the property of being human. And it may be held that Socrates has the property in all possible worlds, even in those where he fails to exist. (Of course, there is a similar issue regarding the existence-conditions of facts across times.)

It is clear that this divergence potentially has dramatic consequences for one's conception of the relationships between facts and propositions. Take for granted that it is necessary that Socrates is human, and that Socrates only contingently exists. Then a proponent of view (b), but not a proponent of view (a), can claim that the proposition that Socrates is human is true in a world iff [being human; Socrates] exists in that world.

A substantialist may either deny or accept that there is an operation of conjunction on facts. If he accepts it, he will presumably view conjunctions of susbtantial facts as themselves complex entities (the opposite view would be very odd), doubly complex indeed, having a conjunctive structure and the conjuncts in turn having their own internal composition. Similar considerations hold of disjunction and negation.

Proponents of (a) are likely to deny that there is an operation of negation on facts. For take the fact [being a philosopher; Socrates], and suppose there is a corresponding negation x. Then as we saw, it would be odd to claim that x is not a complex fact, having Socrates as a component. Suppose x has such a complexity. Now take two worlds w and v, such that in w Socrates exists but is not a philosopher, and in v, Socrates does not exist (and so is not a philosopher either). Then in both worlds, the proposition that Socrates is not a philosopher is true. And according to a proponent of view (a), x exists in w but not in v. The outcome is rather odd. Similar considerations hold of disjunction, but not of conjunction.

So far we have considered two types of complexity facts may have: boolean complexity (which in turn divides into the various types corresponding to the various boolean operations) and the complexity of substantial facts. But there are many other types of complexity one may take facts to have. Think of universal facts (the fact that all men have a brain), modal facts (the fact that it is possible that Socrates is a football player), and so on.

The identity-conditions of a whole often depends upon facts about its parts. When are two substantial facts [R; a, b] and [S; c, d] identical? A plausible answer is: when R = S, a = c and b = d. This answer has consequences for a friend of Modal Criterion. Accepting both the proposed identity-condition and Modal Criterion, one cannot claim that there are distinct but necessarily coextensive properties (which are part of some facts), or that the facts [being human; Socrates] and [having a human member; {Socrates}] are distinct, even on the plausible assumption that they exist in the very same worlds.

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Other Internet Resources

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Acknowledgments

The authors are grateful for support from the Swiss FNS (research projects on “The Theory of Essence”, “Properties and Relations”).

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Kevin Mulligan <kevin.mulligan@unige.ch>
Fabrice Correia <fabricecorreia@gmail.com>

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