Notes to Analytic Feminism

1. Two points about terminology. First, although it can be very useful to draw distinctions among various terms, e.g., ‘androcentrism,’ ‘sexism,’ ‘male bias,’ ‘masculism,’ etc., in this essay ‘male bias’ is a shorthand way to identify a category that includes the others. See Anderson (1995), E. Lloyd (1995a), and Harding (1986, 1991) for various sets of useful distinctions among such categories. Second, in spite of the extreme vagueness of ‘postmodern,’ the term is used here as short hand for positions attributed to postmodern and poststructuralist philosophers either by the authors themselves or those who write about them.

2. In a book of interviews edited by Giovanna Borradori, The American Philosopher (1994), W.V. Quine acquiesces to being labeled post-analytic, and Hilary Putnam notes that mid-twentieth-century analytic philosophers wouldn't recognize what is called analytic philosophy today. Philosophers seem not to use ‘neo-analytic’ to identify either themselves or others. This might result from the ongoing internal process of change in analytic philosophy (in contrast with pragmatists/neo-pragmatists) or from the fact that there are more descriptive ways to characterize the changes, e.g., naturalized epistemology.

3. The author has made it a point to converse informally about such matters with feminist philosophers from continents other than North America. In spite of their not identifying themselves readily as analytic feminists, there are feminists doing similar work in all the Anglophone countries, much of Western Europe, Argentina, and no doubt many other countries as well.

4. Jaggar presented this schema in a May 1972 talk at the American Philosophical Association, “Four Views of Women's Liberation,” in which she cited socialist feminism and lesbian separatism as “new directions.” A revised version was later published as “Political Philosophies of Women's Liberation” in Vetterling-Braggin, et al., 1977. She develops her views fully in her book Feminist Politics and Human Nature (1983).

5. Louise Antony (1993, 1995, 2003) and Harriet Baber (1993) are among those who reject various inferences between liberalism and their method and theory preferences as analytic philosophers. See also Vogler (1995) for a discussion of liberalism, humanism and philosophical feminism. Concerning empiricism, it is likely that those who do or do not want to call themselves empiricists are not all using the term in the same way.

6. Of course, comparable bridge building takes place by feminists in other philosophical traditions as well. Poststructuralist or pragmatist feminists build bridges both with feminists outside their methodological traditions and with nonfeminist poststructuralists or pragmatists. Although many participants in such “bridge-building” conversations may lack background in their colleagues' traditions, they nevertheless progress in their understanding of each other.

7. See the Symposium “Intra-Feminist Criticism and the ‘Rules of Engagement’” in Garry, ed., APA Newsletter on Feminism and Philosophy, Spring 2001, especially the essays by Frye, Garry, Nussbaum, and Scheman.

8. Scheman, 1993, 8, citing a passage from Wittgenstein, “The sickness of a time is cured by an alteration in the mode of life of human beings, and it was possible for the sickness of philosophical problems to get cured only through a changed mode of thought and of life, not through a medicine invented by an individual” (1967, 57).

9. Something like my wider sense of ‘naturalized’ goes by various terms, e.g., Kornblith's “weaker ” version of naturalized epistemology (Kornblith 1994, 3). But given that Kornblith and many other nonfeminist naturalizing philosophers often focus on the “individual” not the “social” sciences, my use of ‘naturalized’ is even wider than Kornblith's. We will discuss feminist criticisms of naturalized epistemology in Section 8. See, for example, Code (1996), Campbell (1998), Rooney (2003), and Addelson (1991), among others.

Feminist social epistemology is receiving little attention in this essay because Heidi Grasswick treats it in detail in the entry Feminist Social Epistemology in this encyclopedia. Although I and many others categorize social epistemology as a type of naturalized epistemology, not everyone agrees. Maureen Linker advocates social epistemology that is not a form of naturalized epistemology, but a “revised rationalized approach to knowledge that takes into account social responsibility” (2003, 167). Linker believes that her view better defends against relativism than can naturalized epistemologies based on Quine, for example, that of Lynn Hankinson Nelson.

10. Richmond Campbell has interesting criticisms of Antony's arguments. He also presents his own version of feminist naturalized epistemology that incorporates moral as well as empirical knowledge. See Campbell 1998, 2001. Also note that page references to Antony's essay are to the 2nd edition of Antony and Witt (2002).

11. Responses to Nussbaum and others are discussed briefly in Section 7. Nussbaum discusses her approach to criticizing other feminists in Nussbaum, 2001. See also note 7 above.

12. Although there are men as well as women who identify themselves as analytic feminists, most are women. It is simply the author's stylistic preference to avoid ‘him/her’ when possible.

13. Tuana's series, from Pennsylvania State University Press, covers major figures in the Western tradition from Plato through contemporary pragmatist, continental, and analytic philosophers. Feminists writing in the volumes come from various methodological backgrounds. Although the canonical figures are mostly men, the series includes volumes on women such as Mary Wollstonecraft, Emma Goldman, Jane Addams, Simone de Beauvoir, Hannah Arendt, Ayn Rand, and Mary Daly. More writing on women philosophers can be found in Mary Ellen Waithe's volumes (1987, 1989, 1991, 1995).

14. A European analytic feminist made even a stronger point than this to the author in conversation. She said that it would make sense to identify herself as an analytic feminist if she lived in North America where analytic philosophers have (academic) power, but that there would be no point in doing so in her own country.

15. Unfortunately, it is important to add that analytic feminist insights have not always been acknowledged by other analytic philosophers. For example, feminists worked on the variety of ways in which values can be significant in epistemology long before other analytic philosophers “discovered” similar points. Comparable observations can also be made of other philosophical traditions as well.

Copyright © 2012 by
Ann Garry <>

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