Notes to Feminist Perspectives on Class and Work

1. According to a feminist variant of this theory, women were the first slaves, seized in warfare between nomadic tribes (Lerner, 1986)

2. Cf. also Eisenstein (1979), Sargent (1981) and Ferguson (1989).

3. However, even those feminists we might today categorize as on the equality side of the equality/difference debate found ways to valorize women's differences from men. For example, although Emma Goldman critiques marriage, housework and motherhood as oppressing women and making them economic dependents of men, she also valorizes free motherhood outside of marriage as fulfilling a basic need of women (Goldman 1969), and Gilman in her utopian novel Herland creates a society only of women, judged superior because motherhood has been elevated to a public office, and is not merely seen as a private task and virtue. Cf. DiQuinzio 1999 for an interesting discussion of the debate between these authors.

4. In order to present this example as one where the woman in question may be seen to be exploited, it is assumed that the total amount of hours that the woman works, both in wage labor and in unpaid housework, is not reciprocated by her husband. Typically in the US, in a joint wage-earning family, the woman's unpaid work in housework is about 4 times as much as the man's, whether or not they work equal hours in waged or salaried work (cf. Folbre 1982). As a consequence, Delphy sees women's work as being unreciprocated labor and thus on that account exploited (Delphy 1984).

Copyright © 2016 by
Ann Ferguson
Rosemary Hennessy
Mecke Nagel <>

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