Supplement to Modal Fictionalism

A Persisting Problem For Fictionalism About Possible Worlds[*]

At least since Gideon Rosen's 1990, the theory that talk about possible worlds should be interpreted as a useful fiction has been taken seriously by many philosophers as a way we might be able to have, in Lewis's phrase, “paradise on the cheap” (Lewis 1986, p. 136).

The point of fictionalism about possible worlds is that if it is successful, it enables one to use the conceptual resources of possible-world semantics without needing the ontological baggage that realism about such worlds carries. The strategy is to employ an account of possible worlds (e.g. David Lewis's),[1] but insist that the account is only a useful fiction. A modal claim will then be true iff its translation into possible-world semantics is true in the fiction (let us call the account treated as fiction by Rosen the “Lewis story”[2]). So, for example, P is possible iff, in the Lewis story, there exists a possible world where P is true. Of course, this does not imply that in reality there is a possible world such that P is true (at least as far as the fictionalist is concerned), any more than its being true in the Arthur legend that King Arthur defeated the Emperor Augustus implies that Arthur (if he existed) really defeated Augustus in battle.

A problem was raised for modal fictionalism independently by Rosen (1993) and Stuart Brock (1993). This problem, to put it in a perhaps oversimplified form, is that since in the Lewis story it is true at each possible world that there are many worlds, it is, according to the fiction (or, according to the story), true at every possible world that there exist many worlds. But the truth conditions offered by a Rosen-style fictionalist state that if according to the fiction a proposition P is true at every world, then P is (in fact) necessarily true. Therefore, it follows in this case that necessarily there are several possible worlds, and so since (necessarily P) implies P, there in fact exist several possible worlds, which is not something the fictionalist should countenance.

This problem is discussed in a paper by Peter Menzies and Philip Pettit (1994) who claim to show that the objection is not fatal, and that there is a coherent and plausible fictionalist way of avoiding it. Menzies and Pettit propose that the fictionalist operator needs to be applied to every quantifier in a modal claim when translating into possible-world talk, either by employing a “prefixing” strategy or an “indexing” strategy (for details see their paper). So while it is not true (for the Menzies/Pettit fictionalist) that “necessarily there exist several worlds”, what is in fact true in virtue of there being several possible worlds that exist at each fictional world is that “necessarily, according to the fiction there exist several worlds”, which is not a claim incompatible with fictionalism at all. However, they recognize a further problem for fictionalism: a problem involving a so-called “modal dangler”, or a modal claim that concerns the truth (or in this case, possible truth) of the theory itself.[3] This supplement will consist of a discussion of this problem, an examination of the solution proposed for it by Menzies and Pettit, and an explanation of why the proposed solution is so far unsatisfactory.

This further objection is more or less as follows: The Lewis story (or the “hypothesis of the plurality of worlds” (PW) as it is referred to by Brock and Menzies/Pettit) will, according to the Lewis story, be something that is true at every world in the Lewis story. This causes the modal fictionalist a real problem, because given the standard paraphrase into possible world semantics, something is necessary iff it is the case at every possible world. Since, in the Lewis story, the Lewis story is correct at every possible world, then the fictionalist who is prepared to translate modal claims into claims about possible worlds (albeit fictional ones) is forced to admit that the truth of the Lewis story is necessary, and thus the Lewis “story” is no mere fiction, but actually correct. (Necessarily-P implies P). However, it is precisely PW, or the Lewis story, that the fictionalist wants to argue is false in the actual world. It appears that the fictionalist (at least one who follows the strategy described) is committed to the truth, and even necessary truth, of the very thesis fictionalism was developed to deny.

Menzies and Pettit suggest an alternative way of constructing one's possible-worlds fictionalism to avoid any commitment to the necessary truth of the Lewis story. They start by pointing to the special status that the actual world has among worlds. Other worlds are (according to our fictionalist) purely fictional entities, so what is true at[4] them is completely determined by the fiction. What is true at the actual world, however, is not determined by what (modal-) fictional stories we choose to tell about it. The truth conditions for the “modal danglers” (statements concerning the modal status of the modal fictionalist theory itself) are to reflect this, on the Menzies-Pettit proposal. According to the proposed paraphrase for the part of modal discourse concerned with modal danglers,

Possibly P if and only if ‘P’ holds at the actual world or at one of the other worlds in PW.

Necessarily P if and only if ‘P’ holds at the actual world and at all of the other worlds posited in PW (1994, p. 36)

Note that these truth conditions do not say “if ‘P’ holds in the actual world on the PW account”. These truth conditions involve what the actual world is really like, and not merely what it is like in a given fictional account. Thus this view allows us to conclude that PW, or the Lewis story, is not necessary, and so we are not forced to admit that it is true.

This modification works to defuse Brock's specific objection about the expressibility of the falsehood of PW, but it does not defuse objections based on counterfactual situations where we would want to say that the Lewis story is not correct. For instance, consider the quite plausible counterfactual “If there were a king of France, still PW would be false”. A fictionalist should want to accept this: after all, changes in the political situation in France will not produce changes in the fundamental truths of the metaphysics of modality (France is not that important). However, consider this modal claim: “It is possible that there be a present king of France and also that PW be false”. Now, it is not true of the actual world that there is a king of France, and it is not true of any of the (supposedly fictional) possible worlds that PW is false there (after all, in the Lewis story, the Lewis story (or PW) holds at every world). The above modal claim about the king and PW is thus false. For a counterfactual with a contingent antecedent to be true it must be possible that the antecedent and consequent be true together. Since it is impossible that there be a king of France and PW be false, it seems that the initial plausible counterfactual cannot be held to be true by the fictionalist.

This sort of objection, of course, is a general one: nothing hinges on the mentioning of the present king of France, as almost any counterfactual will do. The general point is that a fictionalist should be committed, on the grounds of the irrelevance of most changes in the world to the truth of fictionalism, to saying that even if the world had turned out slightly differently, still the Lewis story would have been merely fiction: and this is something that cannot be coherently maintained by a fictionalist who accepts the Menzies/Pettit truth conditions for modal statements.

One might be tempted to think that the entire problem of the modal status of modal danglers (i.e. those statements that concern the truth or modal status of the theory itself) is one that can be ignored, or at least easily avoided, by the fictionalist. After all, the modal danglers are a pretty special class of truths, unlikely to make an impact on science or semantics or other fields in which possible worlds are useful. One way of avoiding the problem of “modal danglers” is to restrict fictionalism so that it does not consider the modal status of the theory itself, but that the theory functions as some sort of “metalanguage” immune to the modal interpretation available for all other areas of discourse. There are at least two good reasons for resisting this strategy, however.[5]

Firstly, it seems ad hoc. Possibility seems to be the same thing in both the sentences “Possibly PW is false” and “Possibly Phlogiston Theory is false”: merely using the word “metalanguage” does not provide explanatory power. Secondly, it leaves the “possibly” operator in modal danglers as a primitive. If we are going to have primitive unanalyzed modalities besides that of “truth in fiction” in our theory anyway, why bother with an analysis of modality in terms of truth-in-fiction? Why not say that all of the modal operators reflect primitive features of the world and abandon the attempt to analyse modality in terms of a modal fiction?

It is too early to say that a Rosen-style modal fictionalism must be abandoned -- after all, merely showing that it has not yet succeeded in analysing the full range of modal claims (e.g. modal danglers) does not imply that it cannot do so, but only that it has not. However, even given the Menzies/Pettit modifications to Rosen's original proposal, modal danglers remain a difficulty for modal fictionalism. Those eager to promote fictionalist analyses of possible worlds talk owe us an answer to this problem.[6]

Return to Modal Fictionalism

Copyright © 2011 by
Daniel Nolan <>

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