Notes to Fideism

1. Paul Gooch has argued that Paul himself should not be read as anti-rational (or anti-philosophical), except insofar as reason is corrupted by hubris. He adds, “But we are not required to conclude that Paul believes that our cognitive equipment is so damaged that it can deliver no theistic knowledge” (p. 97).

2. Though the Vatican I documents do not contain the word “fideism,” they stress the complementarity of faith and reason. “Even if faith is superior to reason there can never be a true divergence between faith and reason, since the same God who reveals the mysteries and bestows the gift of faith has also placed in the human spirit the light of reason. This God could not deny himself, nor could the truth ever contradict the truth” (Dogmatic Constitution on the Catholic Faith Dei Filius, IV:DS 3017).

3. It is interesting to note that Montaigne and Bayle are frequently assumed to have harbored anti-religious intentions. According to this view, they fully appreciated the apparently agnostic implications of their skepticism, and their professions of faith were insincere. Popkin (1964: pp. 56, 108-110) and Penelhum (pp. 18ff) have both argued against this reading. For a detailed discussion of this issue in reference to Bayle, see the essays by Lennon and Mori.

4. For an excellent discussion of this view and its development, see Carroll, 11-15.

5. For a useful discussion of Kierkegaard's self-assessment in The Point of View see Schonbaumsfeld, pp. 61-8.

6. James seems here to be conceiving of the scientific method in terms of verifiability, rather than falsifiability. That it is adequate as a characterization of what scientists do seems doubtful.

7. The Wittgensteinian Fideist might be classified as a religious ironist in a Rortyian (rather than a Kierkegaardian) sense. An “ironist,” in Richard Rorty's sense, is someone who recognizes the contingency of her discourse and “does not think that her vocabulary is closer to reality than others [sic], that it is in touch with a power not herself.” The ironist is thus “never quite able to take [herself] seriously” (p. 73).

Copyright © 2012 by
Richard Amesbury <>

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