Supplement to Frege's Theorem and Foundations for Arithmetic

Reconstruction of the Grundlagen Derivation of Hume's Principle

The derivation of Hume's Principle in Gl, §73, appeals to the following principle, which is a higher-order version of the Law of Extensions:

Principle: G is a member of the extension of the second-order concept equinumerous to F iff G is equinumerous to F

Now Hume's Principle is that the number of Fs is identical to the number of Gs iff F and G are equinumerous. We prove the biconditional in stages.

(→) Assume that the number of Ps is identical to the number of Qs. Then, by the definitions of ‘the number of Ps’ and ‘the number of Qs’, we know that the extension of the concept equinumerous to P is identical with the extension of the concept equinumerous to Q. But it is a fact about equinumerosity that P is equinumerous to P. So by the above Principle, the extension of the concept equinumerous to P has P as a member. So, by substitution of identicals, the extension of the concept equinumerous to Q has P as a member. So P is equinumerous to Q, by the above Principle.

(←) Assume P is equinumerous with Q. We want to show that the number of Ps is identical to the number of Qs. So, by definition, we have to show that the extension of the concept equinumerous to P is identical to the extension of the concept equinumerous to Q. By the Principle of Extensionality, then, we have to show that these two extensions have the same members! So we pick an arbitrary concept S and show that S is a member of the extension of the concept equinumerous to P iff S is a member of the extension of the concept equinumerous to Q.

(→) Assume S is a member of the extension of the concept equinumerous to P (to show: S is a member of the extension of the concept equinumerous to Q). Then, by the above Principle, S is equinumerous to P. So by the transitivity of equinumerosity (this is Fact 4 in the subsection on Equinumerosity in the main portion of the entry), S is equinumerous to Q. So, by the above Principle, S is in the extension of the concept equinumerous to Q

(←) Assume S is a member of the extension of the concept equinumerous to Q (to show: S is a member of the extension of the concept equinumerous to P). Then S is equinumerous to Q, by the above Principle. By the symmetry of equinumerosity (Fact 3 in the subsection on Equinumerosity), it follows that Q is equinumerous to S. So, given our hypothesis that P is equinumerous to Q, it follows by the transitivity of equinumerosity, that P is equinumerous to S. So, again by symmetry, we have: S is equinumerous to P. And, by the above Principle, it follows S is in the extension of the concept equinumerous to P.

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Copyright © 2013 by
Edward N. Zalta <zalta@stanford.edu>

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