Notes to Future Contingents

1. We use double quotes for quotations, direct or indirect, and example sentences and expressions, whereas we use single quotes for terms and names.

2. Another possible translation is “An impossible proposition cannot follow after a possible one.” (See Rescher et al. 1971, p. 190.)

3. This definition might be extended for negative numbers as well, assuming that dur(t1,t2,x) if and only if dur(t2,t1,-x).

4. In an earlier version of the Ockham model Prior did in fact include the idea of “the true future”. Speaking about the Ockham models he wrote: “In each … model there is a single designated route from left to right, taking one direction only at each fork. This represents the actual course of events.” (Prior 1966, p. 157). However, this idea was dropped in Prior’s most famous presentation of the models which he published in his Past, Present and Future (Prior 1967).

5. The term ‘the Thin Red Line’ was inspired by a report from the Crimean War in The London Times: “The Russians dashed on towards that thin red-line streak tipped with a line of steel.” It has even been suggested that the thin red line should in fact be conceived as infrared indicating “that the Thin Red Line does not imply that mortals are capable of seeing the future.” (Belnap et al. 2001, p. 139)

At this point it is worth noting, that Prior when working with the draft for his book Past, Present and Future (1967) used a similar idea of a red line corresponding to the true future. He wrote the following on p. 6 in an undated draft titled “Postulate-sets for Tense-logic”, kept in the Prior Collection at Bodleian Library, Oxford, Box 1:

In these models the course of time (in a rather broad sense of this phrase) is represented by a line which, as it moves from left to right (past to future), continually divides into branches, so that from any given point on the diagram there is a unique route backwards (to the left; to the past) but a variety of routes forwards (to the right; to the future). In each model there is a single designated point, representing the actual present moment; and in an Occamist model there is a single designated line (taking one only of the possible forward routes at each fork), which might be picked out in red, representing the actual course of events.

(We owe this information to Alex Malpass.)

Copyright © 2015 by
Peter Øhrstrøm <>
Per Hasle <>

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