# Nineteenth Century Geometry

*First published Mon Jul 26, 1999; substantive revision Wed Jan 13, 2010*

In the nineteenth century, geometry, like most academic disciplines, went through a period of growth verging on cataclysm. During this period, the content of geometry and its internal diversity increased almost beyond recognition; the axiomatic method, vaunted since antiquity by the admirers of geometry, finally attained true logical sufficiency, and the ground was laid for replacing, in the description of physical phenomena, the standard geometry of Euclid by Riemann's wonderfully pliable system. Modern philosophers of all tendencies — Descartes and Hobbes, Spinoza and Locke, Hume and Kant — had regarded Euclidean geometry as a paradigm of epistemic certainty. The sudden shrinking of Euclidean geometry to a subspecies of the vast family of mathematical theories of space shattered some illusions and prompted important changes in our the philosophical conception of human knowledge. Thus, for instance, after these nineteenth-century developments, philosophers who dream of a completely certain knowledge of right and wrong secured by logical inference from self-evident principles can no longer propose Euclidean geometry as an instance in which a similar goal has proved attainable. The present article reviews the aspects of nineteenth century geometry that are of major interest for philosophy and hints in passing, at their philosophical significance.

- 1. Lobachevskian geometry
- 2. Projective geometry
- 3. Klein's Erlangen program
- 4. Axiomatics perfected
- 5. The differential geometry of Riemann
- 6. Lie Groups
- Bibliography
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Lobachevskian geometry

Euclid (fl. 300 BCE) placed at the head of his *Elements* a
series of ‘definitions’ (e.g., “A point is that which has
no part”) and ‘common notions’ (e.g., “If equals be added
to equals, the sums are equal”), and five ‘requests’.
Supposedly these items conveyed all of the information needed for
inferring the theorems and solving the problems of geometry, but as a
matter of fact they do not. However, the requests
(*aitemata*)—usually called ‘postulates’ in
English—must at any rate be granted or Euclid's proofs will not
go through. Some of them are plainly practical:

1. To draw a straight line from any point to any point. 3. To draw a circle with any center and any radius.

However, the fifth one sounds more like a statement of fact. Euclid's
text can be rendered in English as follows: “If a straight line
[*c*] falling on two straight lines [*a* and *b*]
makes the interior angles on the same side less than two right angles,
the two straight lines [*a* and *b*], if produced
indefinitely, meet on that side on which are the angles less than the
two right angles” (terms in brackets added for clarity). This
sounds far-fetched. Still, it can be readily paraphrased as a recipe
for constructing triangles, (See Figure 1.) Every triangle is formed
by three coplanar straight lines that meet, by pairs, at three
points. Given any segment *P**Q*, draw a straight line a
through *P* and a straight line *b* through *Q*,
so that *a* and *b* lie on the same plane; verify that
the angles that *a* and *b* make with
*P**Q* on one of the two sides of *P**Q*
add up to less than two right angles; if this condition is satisfied,
it should be granted that *a* and *b* meet at a point
*R* on that same side of *P**Q*, thus forming the
triangle PQR. This request is known as “Euclid's
Postulate”. If the request is rejected—say, because we
believe that the world is finite and there is no room in it to
accomodate vertex *R* if the interior angles in question add up
to very little less than two right angles—then much of Euclid's
system of geometry will not go through.

Figure 1

In the darker ages that followed, Euclid's sense of mathematical
freedom was lost and philosophers and mathematicians expected geometry
to rest on self-evident grounds. Now, if *a* is perpendicular
and *b* is almost perpendicular to *P**Q*,
*a* and *b* approach each other very slowly on one side
of *P**Q* and it is not self-evident that they must
eventually meet somewhere on that side. After all, the hyperbole
indefinitely approaches its asymptotes and yet, demonstrably, never
meets them. Through the centuries, several authors demanded—and
attempted—a proof of Euclid's Postulate. John Wallis
(b. 1616, d. 1703) derived it from the assumption that there
are polygons of different sizes that have the same shape. But then
this assumption needs proof in turn. Girolamo Saccheri (b. 1667,
d. 1733) tried *reductio*. He inferred a long series of
propositions from the negation of Euclid's Postulate, until he reached
one which he pronounced “repugnant to the nature of the straight
line”. But Saccheri's understanding of this “nature” was
rooted in Euclidean geometry and his conclusion begged the
question.

In the 1820's, Nikolai I. Lobachevsky (b. 1793, d. 1856)
and Janos Bolyai (b. 1802, d. 1860) independently tackled
this question in a radically new way. Lobachevsky built on the negation
of Euclid's Postulate an alternative system of geometry, which he
dubbed “imaginary” and tried inconclusively to test for
validity at the astronomical scale by calculating the sum of the
internal angles of triangles formed by stars on the sky. Bolyai excised
the postulate from Euclid's system; the remaining rump is the “absolute
geometry”, which can be further specified by adding to it either
Euclid's Postulate or its negation. From the 1790's Carl Friedrich
Gauss (b. 1777, d. 1855) had been working on the subject in
the same direction, but he refrained from publishing for fear of
scandal. Since Lobachevsky was the first to publish, the system of
geometry based on the said “absolute geometry” plus the negation of
Euclid's Postulate is properly called *Lobachevskian
geometry*.

The construction introduced above to explain Euclid's Postulate can
also be used for elucidating its negation. Draw the straight
line *a* through point *P* at right angles with the
segment *P**Q*. If Euclid's Postulate is denied, there
are countless straight lines through *Q*, coplanar
with *a*, that make acute angles with *P**Q* but
never meet *a*. Consider the set of real numbers which are the
magnitudes of these acute angles. Let the greatest lower bound of this
set be μ. Evidently, μ > 0. There are exactly two straight
lines through
*Q*, coplanar with *a*, that make an angle of size μ with
*P**Q*. (See Figure 2.) Call them *b*_{1}
and *b*_{2}. Neither *b*_{1} nor
*b*_{2} meets *a*, but *a* meets every
line through *Q* that is coplanar with *a* and makes
with *P**Q* an angle less than μ. Gauss, Lobachevsky
and Bolyai—unbeknownst to each other—coincided in calling
*b*_{1} and *b*_{2} *the*
parallels to *a* through *Q*. μ is called the angle
of parallellism for segment *P**Q*. Its size depends on
the length of *P**Q*, and decreases as the latter
increases.

Figure 2

Suppose that the angle of parallellism for *P**Q* is one
half a right angle. In this case, *b*_{1} and
*b*_{2} make a right angle at *Q* and we thus
have two mutually perpendicular straight lines on the same plane as *a*,
which fail to meet *a*.

Lobachevsky's geometry abounds in surprising theorems (many of which
had already been found by Saccheri). Here are a few: The three interior
angles of a triangle add up to *less* than two right angles. The
difference or “defect” is proportional to the triangle's area. Hence,
in Lobachevskian geometry, similar triangles are congruent. Moreover,
if a triangle is divided into smaller triangles, the defect of the
whole equals the sum of the defects of the parts. Since the defect
cannot be greater than two right angles, the area of triangles has a
finite maximum. If a quadrilateral, by construction, has three right
angles, the fourth angle is necessarily acute. Thus, in Lobachevskian
geometry there are no rectangles.

There is a simple formal correspondence between the equations of Lobachevskian trigonometry and those of standard spherical trigonometry. Based on it, Lobachevsky argued that any contradiction arising in his geometry would inevitably be matched by a contradiction in Euclidean geometry. This appears to be the earliest example of a purported proof of relative consistency, by which a theory is shown to be consistent lest another theory — whose consistency is typically taken for granted — be inconsistent.

Lobachevskian geometry received little attention before the late 1860s. When philosophers finally took notice of it, their opinions were divided. Some regarded it as a formal exercise in logical deduction, with no physical or philosophical significance, which employed ordinary words—such as ‘straight’ and ‘plane’—with a covertly changed meaning. Others welcomed it as sufficient proof that, contrary to the influential thesis of Kant, Euclidean geometry does not convey any prerequisites of human experience and that the geometrical structure of physical space is open to experimental inquiry. Still others agreed that Non-Euclidean geometries were legitimate alternatives, but pointed out that the design and interpretation of physical experiments generally presupposes a definite geometry and that this role has been preempted by Euclid's system.

No matter what philosophers might say, for mathematicians Lobachevskian geometry would probably have been no more than an odd curiosity, if a niche had not been found for it within both projective and differential geometry, the two main currents of nineteenth-century geometrical research (§§ 2 and 5).

## 2. Projective geometry

Today projective geometry does not play a big role in mathematics, but in the late nineteenth century it came to be synonymous with modern geometry. Projective methods had been employed by Desargues (b. 1591, d. 1661) and Pascal (b. 1623, d. 1662), but were later eclipsed by Descartes's method of coordinates. They prospered, however, after Jean-Victor Poncelet (b. 1788, d. 1867) showed that the projective properties of figures furnished grounds of proof that were at least as powerful as, and certainly more intuitive and ostensibly compelling than the Cartesian procedure of setting up and solving equations between numbers representing points.

Projective properties are those preserved by projections. Take, for
example, two planes Γ and *H* and a point *P*
outside them. Let Φ be any figure on Γ. Draw straight lines
from *P* through each point of Φ. The figure formed by the
points where these lines meet *H* is the projection of Φ on
*H* from *P*. Generally this figure will differ from
Φ in size and shape. But the projection of any number of straight
lines on Γ meeting each other at certain points generally
consists of an equal number of straight lines on *H* meeting
respectively at the projection of those points. What happens, however,
if the straight line joining *P* with some point *Q* of
Γ never meets *H*, because *P**Q* happens
to lie on a plane parallel to *H*? (See Figure 3.)

Figure 3

To obviate such irksome exceptions, projective geometry added to each straight line in space an ideal point, shared by every line parallel to it. Continuity requires then that all ideal points lie on a single ideal plane, which meets each family of parallel planes along a different ideal line. Fundamentalists may shudder at this seemingly wanton multiplication of entities. However, it had been practised in arithmetic for centuries, as the initial stock of natural numbers 1, 2, 3, … , was supplemented with zero, the negative integers, the non-integral rationals, the irrationals, and the so-called imaginary numbers.

The points of a straight line stand in mutual relations of
neighborhood and order. To see how the ideal point fits into these
relations let *H* rotate continually about the straight line
*m* where it intersects Γ. (See Figure 4.) When
*H* is parallel to *P**Q*—say, at time
*t*—the projection of *Q* on *H* from
*P* is the ideal point of the straight line through *P*
and *Q*. Right before *t* the said projection is an
ordinary point of *H*, very far from *m*. Right after
*t* the projection is again an ordinary point of *H*,
very far from *m*, but at the opposite end of the
plane. Studying the continuous displacement of the projection during a
short time interval surrounding *t*, one concludes that if
*A* and *B* are any two points of *H* that stand,
respectively, on either side of *m*, the ideal point of the
straight line through *A* and *B* must be placed between
*A* and *B*. Thus, in projective geometry, the points
of a straight line are ordered cyclically, i.e., like the points of a
circle. As a result of this, the neighborhood relations among points
in projective space and on projective planes differ drastically from
those familiar from standard geometry, and are highly
counterintuitive. It is fair to say that projective geometry signified
a much deeper and far-reaching revolution in human thought than did
the mere denial of Euclid's Postulate.

Figure 4

In the new setting, the projective properties of figures can be
defined unexceptionably. a one-one mapping *f* of projective
space onto itself is a *collineation* if it sends any three
collinear points *A*, *B*, and *C*, to three
points (*A*), (*B*), and (*C*), which are
collinear too. Projective properties (and relations) are those which
are preserved by collineations. Here are a few examples of projective
properties. Of three or more points: to lie on the same straight line;
to lie on the same plane. Of three or more straight lines: to meet at
the same point; to lie on the same plane. Of three or more planes: to
intersect along the same straight line; to share the same point. Of
curves: to be a conic. Of surfaces: to be a quadric.

## 3. Klein's Erlangen program

In a booklet issued when he joined the faculty at Erlangen (1872), Felix Klein (b. 1849, d. 1925) took stock of the enormous growth and diversification of geometry and proposed a standpoint from which its many branches could be organized into a system. From this standpoint, the task of a branch of geometry can be stated thus:

Given a manifold and a group of transformations of the manifold, to study the manifold configurations with respect to those features which are not altered by the transformations of the group. (Klein 1893, p. 67)

In nineteenth-century mathematics, ‘manifold’ often designated what we now call a set, but Klein apparently had something more specific in mind:

Ifnvariablesx_{1}, … ,x_{n}are given, the … value systems we obtain if we let the variablesxindependently take the real values from −∞ to +∞ constitute what we shall call …a manifold of n dimensions. Each particular value system (x_{1}, … ,x_{n}) is called anelementof the manifold. (Klein 1873, p. 116)

If *S* is a manifold in either sense, by a *transformation
of S* we mean a one-one mapping of *S* onto itself. It is
clear that

- If
*T*_{1}and*T*_{2}are transformations of*S*, the composite mapping*T*_{2}○*T*_{1}, which consists of*T*_{1}followed by*T*_{2}, is also a transformation of*S*; - the composition of transformations is associative, so that, if
*T*_{1},*T*_{2}and*T*_{3}are transformations of*S*, (*T*_{3}○*T*_{2}) ○*T*_{1}=*T*_{3}○ (*T*_{2}○*T*_{1}); - the identity mapping I that sends each point of
*S*to itself is a transformation of*S*such that, for any transformation*T*,*T*○*I*=*I*○*T*=*T*; - for every transformation
*T*there is a transformation*T*^{−1}, the*inverse*of*T*, such that*T*^{−1}○*T*= I (*T*^{−1}sends each point of*S*back to where it was brought from by*T*).

By virtue of conditions (i)-(iv), the transformations of *S*
form a *group* *G*_{S} in
the precise sense that this term has in algebra.
*G*_{S} includes subgroups, i.e.,
subsets which contain I and satisfy conditions (i) and (iv). If *H* is a
subgroup of *G*_{S} and Φ is a
feature of *S*, or of its elements or parts, which is not
affected by the transformations of Φ, we say that Φ is
*H*-invariant. The only *G*_{S}-invariant
is the cardinality of *S* (i.e., the number of elements in the
manifold). On the other hand, the group {*I*}, consisting of the identity
alone, trivially preserves every conceivable feature. Between these two
extremes there can be many different subgroups with all sorts of
interesting invariants, depending on the respective group structure. If
*S* is not an arbitrary (structureless) set, but a numerical
manifold as described by Klein, it inherits structure from the real
number field, which contributes to characterize the different subgroups
of *G*_{S} and their invariants.
Thus, the group of continuous transformations preserves the topological
properties (neighborhood relations), and the group of linear
transformations preserves the projective properties.

Can metric properties be fixed in this way? Traditionally one
defines the distance between two points (*x*_{1}, …
,*x*_{n}) and (*y*_{1}, … ,*y*_{n}) of a
numerical manifold as the positive square root of
(*x*_{1} − *y*_{1})^{
2} + … +
(*x*_{n} − *y*_{
n})^{2}. The group of isometries consists of the
transformations that preserve this function. However, this is just a
convention, adopted to ensure that the geometry is Euclidean. Using
projective geometry, Klein thought of something better. No real-valued
function of point pairs, defined on all projective space, is an
invariant of the projective group, but there is a function of collinear
point quadruples, called the *cross-ratio*, which is such an
invariant. Drawing on work by Arthur Cayley (b. 1821,
d. 1895), Klein (1871, 1873) considered the cross-ratio of point
quadruples
<*P*_{1},*P*_{2},*P*_{3},*P*_{4}>. such
that *P*_{3} and *P*_{4} belong to a given conic κ on
a projective plane, while *P*_{1} and *P*_{2} range over a
region
**R**
that is bounded by or
otherwise fixed by κ. Since *P*_{3} and *P*_{4} must
be the points where the straight line through *P*_{1} and
*P*_{2} meets κ, the said cross-ratio may be regarded as a
function of the point pair <*P*_{1},*P*_{2}>. The
collineations that map a given conic onto itself form a group, and the
said function is clearly an invariant of this group. Klein showed that
a certain function of this function behaves like an ordinary distance
function on
**R**.
According to the nature
of the conic κ, the structure determined by this function
satisfies either (i) all the theorems of Euclidian plane geometry, or
(ii) all those of Lobachevskian plane geometry, or (iii) those of a
third geometry which Klein himself discovered and dubbed
‘elliptic’. (In elliptic geometry every straight line meets
every other, and the three internal angles of a triangle always add up
to more than two right angles. Klein's names for the geometries of
Euclid and Lobachevsky were ‘parabolic’ and
‘hyperbolic’, respectively.)

This is how Klein's approach works for Lobachevskian geometry on the
plane. Let κ be a real conic—a conic comprising only real
points—on the projective plane. Let *G*_{κ} be the
set of all collineations that map κ onto itself.
*G*_{κ} is a subgroup of the projective group. Consider now
the cross-ratio of point quadruples
<*P*_{1},*P*_{2},*P*_{3},*P*_{4}> such
that *P*_{3} and *P*_{4} belong to κ, while
*P*_{1} and *P*_{2} range over the interior Int(κ) of
the region of the real plane bounded by κ.
(*P* ∈ Int(κ) if and only if *P* is a real point
and no real tangent to κ passes through *P*.) As noted above, the
choice of points *P*_{1} and *P*_{2} fixes *P*_{3}
and *P*_{4}, so the said cross-ratio may be regarded as a
function of the first pair of points only, say,
*f*_{κ}(*P*_{1},*P*_{2}). The function
*f*_{κ} is clearly *G*_{κ}-invariant. Put
*d*_{κ}(*P*_{1},*P*_{2}) =
*c* log *f*_{κ}(*P*_{1},*P*_{2}),
where *c* is an arbitrary real-valued constant, different from
0, and log *x* denotes the principal value of the natural logarithm of *x*.
Klein was able to show that *d*_{κ} behaves precisely like
a Lobachevskian distance function on Int(κ). In other words,
every theorem of Lobachevskian geometry holds for suitable figures
formed from points of Int(κ), if the distance between any two of
these points is given by the function *d*_{κ}. Consider,
for instance, four points *P*_{1},*P*_{2},*P*_{3},
and *P*_{4} in Int(κ), such that
*d*_{κ}(*P*_{1},*P*_{2}) =
*d*_{κ}(*P*_{2},*P*_{3}) =
*d*_{κ}(*P*_{3},*P*_{4}) =
*d*_{κ}(*P*_{4},*P*_{1}). They are the vertices
of a Lobachevskian equilateral quadrilateral *Q*, which can have at most
three right angles, in which case the fourth interior angle of *Q* must
be acute. (Where ‘right angle’ means, as usual, an angle
equal to its adjacent angle, and two angles in Int(κ) are said to
be equal if one is the image of the other by a transformation of group
*G*_{κ}).

If κ stands for a different sort of conic, not an ordinary
real one, the function *d*_{κ} obtained by the above
procedure behaves on suitably defined regions of the projective plane
like a Euclidian distance function or like the distance function of
elliptic geometry (this depends on the nature of the conic κ).
Thus, depending on whether κ belongs to one or the other of three
kinds of conic, the group of collineations that map κ onto itself
is structurally identical with one of the three groups of
Lobachevskian, Euclidean, or elliptic isometries. Similar results hold
for the three-dimensional case, with κ a quadric surface.

Klein's result led Bertrand Russell (b. 1873, d. 1970) to
assert, in his neo-Kantian book on the foundations of geometry (1897),
that the general “form of externality” is disclosed to
us a priori in projective geometry, but its metric
structure—which can *only* be Lobachevskian, Euclidean or
elliptic—must be determined a posteriori by experiment. Henri
Poincaré (b. 1854, d. 1912) took a more radical
stance: If geometry is nothing but the study of a group,

one may say that the truth of the geometry of Euclid is not incompatible with the truth of the geometry of Lobachevsky, for the existence of a group is not incompatible with that of another group. (Poincaré 1887, p. 290)

The application to physics is immediate: “Among all possible groups
we have chosen one in particular, in order to refer to it all physical
phenomena, just as we choose three coordinate axes in order to refer to
them a geometrical figure” (ibid., p. 291). The choice of this
particular group is motivated by its mathematical simplicity, but also
by the fact that “there exist in nature some remarkable bodies which
are called *solids*, and experience tells us that the different
possible movements of these bodies are related to one another much in
the same way as the different operations of the chosen group” (ibid.).
These remarks of Poincaré signalled the beginning of
conventionalism in the philosophy of science and provided its initial
motivation.

Klein's group-theoretical view of geometry enjoyed much favor among mathematicians and philosophers. It achieved a major success when Minkowski (1909) showed that the gist of Einstein's special theory of relativity was the (spacetime) geometry of the Lorentz group. But Klein's Erlangen program failed to cover the differential geometry of Riemann (§5), which Einstein (1915, 1916) placed at the core of his general theory of relativity.

## 4. Axiomatics perfected

According to Aristotle, scientific knowledge (*episteme*) must
be expressed in statements that follow deductively from a finite list
of self-evident statements (axioms) and only employ terms defined from
a finite list of self-understood terms (primitives). For over two
millennia it was generally assumed that Aristotle's ideal is actually
realized in Euclid's *Elements*. As a matter of fact, there is a
logical gap already in Euclid I.1 (the solution of this problem rests
on an unstated assumption of continuity) and it is not clear that
Euclid regarded his postulates as self-evident (by calling them
‘requests’ he suggested he did not). The idea of securing
knowledge by logical deduction from unquestionable principles had a
powerful fascination for modern scientists such as Galileo and Newton,
both of whom fondly practised axiomatics, at any rate as a literary
form, like Spinoza in his *Ethics*. Still, a truly satisfactory
and, if one may say so, serious instance of axiomatization of a branch
of knowledge was not available in print until 1882, when Moritz Pasch
(b. 1843, d. 1930) published his *Lectures on Modern
Geometry*.

Pasch viewed geometry as a natural science, whose successful utilization by other sciences and in practical life rests “exclusively on the fact that geometrical concepts originally agreed exactly with empirical objects” (Pasch 1882, p. iii). Geometry distinguishes itself from other natural sciences because it obtains only very few concepts and laws directly from experience, and aims at obtaining from them the laws of more complex phenomena by purely deductive means. The empirical foundation of geometry was encapsulated by Pasch in a core of basic concepts and basic statements or axioms. The basic concepts refer to the shape and size of bodies and their positions relative to one another. They are not defined, for no definition could replace the “exhibition of appropriate natural objects,” which is the only road to understanding such simple, irreducible notions (ibid., p. 16). All other geometric concepts must be ultimately defined in terms of the basic ones. The basic concepts are connected to one another by the axioms, which “state what has been observed in certain very simple diagrams” (p. 43). All other geometric statements must be proved from the axioms by the strictest deductive methods. Everything that is needed to prove them must be recorded, without exception, in the axioms. These must therefore embody the whole empirical material elaborated by geometry, so that “after they are established it is no longer necessary to resort to sense perceptions” (p. 17). “Every conclusion which occurs in a proof must find its confirmation in the diagram, but it is not justified by the diagram, but by a definite earlier statement (or definition)” (p. 43). Pasch understood clearly the implications of his method. He writes (p. 98):

If geometry is to be truly deductive, the process of inference must be independent in all its parts from themeaningof the geometric concepts, just as it must be independent from the diagrams. All that need be considered are therelationsbetween the geometric concepts, recorded in the statements and definitions. In the course of deduction it is both permitted and useful to bear in mind the meaning of the geometric concepts that occur in it, butit is not at all necessary. Indeed, when it actually beomes necessary, this shows that there is a gap in the proof, and—if the gap cannot be eliminated by modifying the argument—that the premises are too weak to support it.

Pasch's *Lectures on Modern Geometry* dealt with projective
geometry. The first axiomatization of Euclidean geometry that was up to
Pasch's standards—*Foundations of Geometry* by David
Hilbert (b. 1862, d. 1943)—appeared in 1899 and
exercised enormous influence on twentieth century mathematics and
philosophy. Hilbert invites the reader to consider three arbitrary
collections of objects, which he calls ‘points’,
‘straight lines’ and ‘planes’, and five
undefined relations between (i) a point and a straight line, (ii) a
straight line and a plane, (iii) three points, (iv) two pairs of points
(‘segments’) and (v) two equivalence classes of point
triples (‘angles’). The conditions prescribed in Hilbert's
20 axioms—including the Axiom of Completeness added in the second
edition—are sufficient to characterize the said objects and
relations up to isomorphism. Isomorphism—i.e., structural
equivalence—can hold, however, between different, intuitively
disparate, systems of objects. Hilbert availed himself of this feature
of axiomatic theories for studying the independence of some axioms from
the rest. To prove it he proposed actual instances (models) of the
structure determined by all axioms but one, plus the negation of the
omitted one. Frege complained that the geometric axioms retained in
these exercises could be applied to Hilbert's far-fetched models only
by tampering with the natural meaning of words (cf. Alice's
conversation with Humpty Dumpty). Hilbert replied on 29 December 1899:

Every theory is only a scaffolding or schema of concepts together with their necessary mutual relations, and the basic elements can be conceived in any way you wish. If I take for my points any system of things, for example, the system love, law, chimney-sweep, … and I just assume all my axioms as relations between these things, my theorems—for example, the theorem of Pythagoras—also hold of these things. … This feature of theories can never be a shortcoming and is in any case inevitable.

All this follows, of course, from the very nature of axiomatics, as
explained in the passage quoted from Pasch. Indeed, such
truth-preserving semantic permutations were no news in geometry after
Gergonne (1771–1859) drew attention in 1825 to the following
*principle of duality:* Any true statement of projective plane
geometry gives rise to another, equally true, dual statement obtained
by substituting ‘point’ for ‘line’,
‘collinear’ for ‘concurrent’,
‘meet’ for ‘join’, and vice versa, wherever
these words occur in the former. (In projective space geometry, duality
holds for points and planes.) The same result is secured, of course, by
exchanging not the words, but their meanings.

## 5. The differential geometry of Riemann

In a lecture “On the hypotheses that lie at the foundation of geometry”, delivered to the Faculty of Philosophy at Göttingen in 1854 and posthumously published in 1867, Bernhard Riemann (b. 1826, d. 1866) presented some radically innovative views on this matter. He noted that the measurable properties of a discrete manifold can be readily determined by counting. (Think of the population of a country, and the proportion of born-again Christians, or of couples who divorced within the first year of their marriage.) But continuous manifolds do not admit this approach. In particular, the measurable properties of physical space, which are the subject of geometry, depend on the binding forces that act on it. The distance between two points in space can be ascertained with a rod, or a tape, or by optical means, and the result depends essentially on the physical behavior of the instruments used. Up to now, the measurable properties of space have been successfully described in accordance with Euclidean geometry. However, “the empirical concepts on which the metric determinations of space are based—the concepts of a rigid body and a light ray—lose their validity in the infinitely small; it is therefore quite likely that the metric relations of space in the infinitely small do not agree with the assumptions of geometry, and in fact one would have to accept this as soon as the phenomena can thereby be explained in a simpler way” (Riemann 1854, p. 149). To prepare physicists for this eventuality, Riemann proposed a more general conception of geometry. Riemann's basic scheme makes allowance for much greater generality than he actually reaches for; but, in his judgment, it should be enough for the time being to characterize the geometry of continuous manifolds in such a way that it agrees optimally with Euclidean geometry on a small neighborhood of each point.

Riemann extends to *n* dimensions the methods employed by Gauss
(1828) in his study of the intrinsic geometry of curved surfaces
embedded in Euclidean space (called ‘intrinsic’ because it
describes the metric properties that the surfaces display by
themselves, independently of the way they lie in space). Looking back
at Gauss's work one gets a better intuitive feel for Riemann's
concepts (see Torretti 1978, pp. 68–82). However, for the sake of
conciseness and perspicuity, it is advisable to look forward and to
avail oneself of certain concepts introduced by later mathematicians
as they tried to make sense of Riemann's proposal. Consider the modern
formulation of Riemann's theory in the supplement
A Modern Formulation of Riemann's Theory.

In his study of curved surfaces, Gauss introduced a real-valued
function, the *Gaussian curvature*, which measures a surface's
local deviation from flatness in terms of the surface's intrinsic
geometry. Riemann extended this concept of curvature to Riemannian
*n*-manifolds. By using his extended concept of curvature, he was able to
characterize with great elegance the metric manifolds in which all
figures can freely move around without changing their size and shape.
They are the Riemannian manifolds of *constant curvature*. This
idea can be nicely combined with Klein's classification of metric
geometries. Regarded as Riemannian 3-manifolds, Euclidean space has
constant zero curvature, Lobachevskian space has constant negative
curvature, and elliptic space has constant positive curvature. Pursuant
to the Erlangen Program, each of these geometries of constant curvature
is characterized by its own group of isometries. But Klein's conception
is too narrow to embrace all Riemannian geometries, which include
spaces of variable curvature. Indeed, in the general case, the group of
isometries of a Riemannian *n*-manifold is the trivial group consisting
of the identity alone, whose structure conveys no information at all
about the respective geometry.

## 6. Lie Groups

For a philosopher, the most satisfying feature of the tremendous
complication attained by 19th-century mathematics was perhaps the
promptness with which the newly created (or discovered?) mathematical
structures found their way into empirical science, enabling the
intellectual grasp and handling of actual phenomena. We shall wind up
this survey of 19th-century geometry with a few light remarks on a
particularly rich and fruitful structure that has pride of place in
current physics, namely, *Lie groups*, so called after Sophus Lie
(1842–1899), the Norwegian mathematician who studied them in
depth after 1870. A Lie group is, of course, a group in the algebraic
sense we met in §3, that is, a set *G* such that (i) every
ordered pair <*x*,*y*> ∈ *G* is associated
to a unique element *x* · *y*
∈ *G* (known as the *product* or the *sum*
of *x* and *y*); (ii) the product operation is associative,
i.e., (*x* · *y*)
· *z* = *x* ·
(*y* · *z*), for
every *x*, *y*, *z* ∈ *G*; (iii) there is a
one and only one element 0 ∈ *G* such that for
every *x* ∈ *G*, *x* ·
0 = 0 · *x* = *x* (0
is the *identity* or *neutral element* of *G*); (iv)
for every *x* ∈ *G*, there is one and only one
element *x*^{−1} ∈ *G* such
that *x*
· *x*^{−1} = 0
(*x*^{−1} is known as the *inverse*
of *x*). But a Lie group is also a smooth manifold, as described
in the supplement
A Modern Formulation of Riemann's Theory:
the set *G* can be
represented patchwise by systems of real-valued (or alternatively
complex-valued) coordinates, mutually linked by well-defined,
differentiable coordinate transformations wherever their respective
patches overlap. The group and manifold structures of *G* are meshed
together by the condition that the product operation is a
differentiable mapping of *G* × *G* into *G*.

A simple, yet important, example of a Lie group is the group SO(2), instantiated by the rotations of the plane about an arbitrary fixed point. The manifold is topologically compact and therefore cannot be covered by a single coordinate patch, but three will suffice: one including, say, all counterclockwise rotations by more than three radians and less than four, which can be naturally coordinatized using the real numbers in the open interval (3,4); another patch comprising the inverses of the former, which can be mapped onto the open interval (−4,−3), and a third one covering all counterclockwise rotations by less than two right angles plus their clockwise inverses, which can be mapped onto the open interval (−π,π). Indeed, all the groups we encountered in §3, which Klein used for characterizing the Euclidean geometry of space and the classical Non-Euclidean geometries, are Lie groups, and their respective smooth manifold structures allow for topological quirks. Thus the Euclidean isometries constitute a disconnected manifold, with mirror reflection not included in the same component as the subgroup of Euclidean motions.

Like all smooth manifolds, a Lie group *G* has a tangent vector
space attached to each element. In particular, the tangent space at
the neutral element 0 of *G* becomes the *Lie algebra*
of *G* by the definition of the so-called *Lie bracket*, a
bilinear mapping of *T*_{0}*G*
× *T*_{0}*G*
into *T*_{0}*G*, which, for
all *u*,*v*,*w* in *T*_{0}*G*
satisfies the condition [*u*,*u*] = 0 and the Jacobi
identity: [*u*,[*v*,*w*]] +
[*v*,[*w*,*u*]] + [*w*,[*u*,*v*]] =
0. The Lie algebra of *G* throws much light on the structure
of *G* through the homeomorphic (“exponential”) mapping of a
neighborhood of 0 ∈ *T*_{0}*G* into a
neighborhood of 0 ∈ *G*.

In the supplement
A Modern Formulation of Riemann's Theory
we touch on the idea of a *fiber bundle*, formed by two smooth
manifolds *F* and *M*, bound together by a “projection”
mapping π of *F* onto *M*, which partitions the
manifold *F* into “fibers”, mapped by π to the different
points of *M*. A fiber bundle <*F*,*M*,π>
becomes a *principal fiber bundle*
<*F*,*M*,π,*G*> if a Lie group *G*,
known as the bundle's *structure group*, acts on *F* in such
a way that each fiber of *F* is an orbit of the action and a few
other conditions are met. For instance, the Lorentz group is the
structure group of the principal fiber bundle of tetrads (orthonormal
4-tuples of tangent vectors at each point) on any relativistic
spacetime, no matter how bizarre. In such ways, Lie groups provide a
means of unifying the many models allowed by a physical theory and of
introducing some degree of homogeneity among them.

During the last third of the 20th-century, fibre bundles and their Lie
groups have virtually taken over fundamental physics. This is not the
place to explain how or why, but the unstoppable evolution of physics
towards ever more mathematically sophisticated, *prima facie*
less straightforward representations of its subject-matter, deserves
the attention of philosophers. It is clear that the concept of a
definite stable thing out there, which might, at least in principle,
be held and manipulated, is no longer so serviceable to us as it was
once to our flint-carving ancestors.

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### Suggested readings

- Blumenthal, L. M., 1961.
*A Modern View of Geometry*, San Francisco: Freeman. - Boi, Luciano, 1995.
*Le problème mathématique de l'espace: Une quête de l'intelligible*, Berlin: Springer. - Bonola, R., 1955.
*Non-Euclidean Geometry: A critical and historical study of its development*. English translation with additional appendices by H.S. Carslaw. New York: Dover. - Freudenthal, H., 1957. “Zur Geschichte der Grundlagen der
Geometrie,”
*Nieuw Archief vor Wiskunde*, 5: 105–142. - Freudenthal, H., 1960. “Die Grundlagen der Geometrie um die Wende
des 19. Jahrhunderts,”
*Mathematisch-physikalische Semesterbericht*, 7: 2–25. - Gallot, S., D. Hulin, and J. Lafontaine. 2004.
*Riemannian Geometry*, Berlin: Springer, 3rd edition. (An up-to-date textbook, with solutions to odd-numbered exercises. A section is devoted to the “pseudo”-Riemannian geometry employed in Relativity Theory.) - Giedymin, J. 1982.
*Science and Convention: Essays on Henri Poincaré's Philosophy of Science and the Conventionalist Tradition*, Oxford: Pergamon. - Greenberg, M. J. 2008.
*Euclidean & Non-Euclidean Geometry: Development and History*, New York: Freeman, 4th edition. (An excellent tool for self-study at the high-school senior or college freshman level.) - Heath, T. L., 1956.
*The Thirteen Books of Euclid's Elements*, translated from the text of Heiberg with introduction and commentary, New York: Dover, 3 volumes, 2nd edition, revised with additions. - Magnani, L., 2001.
*Philosophy and Geometry: Theoretical and Historical Issues*, Dordrecht: Kluwer. - Nagel, E., 1939. “The formation of modern conceptions of formal
logic in the development of geometry,”
*Osiris*, 7: 142–224. - O'Neill, B., 1983.
*Semi-Riemannian Geometry with Applications to Relativity*, New York: Academic Press. - Nomizu, K., 1956.
*Lie Groups and Differential Geometry*, Tokyo: The Mathematical Society of Japan. - Ronan, M., 2008. “Lie Theory,” in T. Gowers (ed.),
*The Princeton Companion to Mathematics*, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, pp. 229–234. - Rosenfeld, B. A., 1988.
*A History of Non-Euclidean Geometry: Evolution of the Concept of a Geometric Space*, translated by Abe Shenitzer, New York: Springer. - Spivak, M., 1979.
*A Comprehensive Introduction to Differential Geometry*(5 volumes), Berkeley: Publish or Perish, 2nd edition. (Contains an excellent English translation, with mathematical commentary, of Riemann's lecture “On the hypotheses that lie at the foundation of geometry”; see Vol. 2, pp. 135ff.) - Torretti, R., 1978.
*Philosophy of Geometry from Riemann to Poincaré*, Dordrecht: Reidel. (Corrected reprint: Dordrecht, Reidel, 1984). - Trudeau, R. J., 1987.
*The Non-Euclidean Revolution*, Boston: Birkhäuser. - Winnie, J. W., 1986. “Invariants and objectivity: A theory with
applications to relativity and geometry,” in R. G. Colodny (ed.),
*From Quarks to Quasars*, Pittsburgh: Pittsburgh University Press, pp. 71–180.

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### Acknowledgments

I thank John Norton for the illustrations and for ideas leading to a better presentation of some mathematical concepts. I am also very grateful to Edward Zalta for his painstaking editorial work and for having identified and firmly rejected a murky passage in the first version of this article. [Added in 2003:] I thank John Corcoran for his very apt critical comments, which prompted changes in several passages of the 1999 text.