#### Supplement to Nineteenth Century Geometry

## A Modern Formulation of Riemann's Theory

The multidimensional continua that Riemann was concerned with are
essentially instances of what is now known as a real *n-dimensional
smooth manifold*. For brevity, call them
‘*n-manifolds*’. (For example, a sphere, a
Möbius strip and the surface of a Henry Moore sculpture may be
regarded as 2-manifolds; the spacetimes models of current cosmology
are 4-manifolds.) Conditions (a) – (c) provide a full
characterization of *n*-manifolds.

(a) Ann-manifoldMis a set of points that can be pieced together from partially overlapping patches, such that every point ofMlies in at least one patch.(b)

Mis endowed with a neighborhood structure (a topology) such that, ifUis a patch ofM, there is a continuous one-one mappingfofUonto some region ofR^{n}, with continuous inversef^{−1}. (R^{n}denotes here the collection of all real numbern-tuples, with the standard topology generated by the open balls.)fis a coordinate system orchartofM; thek-th number in then-tuple assigned by a chartfto a pointPinf's patch is called thek-th coordinate ofPbyf; thek-th coordinate function of chartfis the real-valued function that assigns to each point of the patch itsk-th coordinate byf.(c) There is a collection

Aof charts ofM, which contains at least one chart defined on each patch ofMand is such that, ifgandhbelong toA, the composite mappingsh○g^{−1}andg○h^{−1}— known ascoordinate transformations— are differentiable to every order wherever they are well defined. (Denote the real numbern-tuple <a_{1}, … ,a_{n}> bya. The mappingh○g^{−1}is well defined ataifais the valued assigned bygto some pointPofMto whichhalso assigns a value. Suppose that the latter valueh(P) = <b_{1}, … ,b_{n}> =b; then,b=h○g^{−1}(a). Sinceh○g^{−1}maps a region ofR^{n}intoR^{n}, it makes sense to say thath○g^{−1}is differentiable.) Such a collectionAis called anatlas.^{[1]}

It is the pair <**M**, **A**> that,
strictly speaking, is an *n*-manifold, in the sense defined above. If
<**M**_{1},**A**_{1}>
and
<**M**_{2},**A**_{2}>
are an *n*-manifold and an *m*-manifold, respectively, it makes good sense
to say that a mapping *f* of **M**_{1} into
**M**_{2} is differentiable at a point *P* of
**M**_{1} if, for a chart *h* defined at *P* and a
chart *g* defined at *f*(*P*), the composite mapping
*g* ○ *f* ○ *h*^{−1}
is differentiable at *h*(*P*). (Condition (c) implies that the fulfillment
of this requirement does not depend on the choice of *h* and *g*.)
*f* is differentiable if it is differentiable at every point of
**M**_{1}.

Let <**M**,**A**> be an *n*-manifold.
To each point *P* of **M** one associates a vector space,
which is known as the *tangent space at P* and is denoted by
*T*_{P}**M**. The idea is based on
the intuitive notion of a plane tangent to a surface at a given point.
It can be constructed as follows. Let
γ
be a one-one differentiable mapping of a real open interval
**I** into **M**. We can think of the
successive values of γ as forming the path of a point that moves
through **M** during a time interval represented by
**I**. We call γ a *curve* in
**M** (parametrized by *u* ∈
**I**). Put γ(*t*_{0})
= *P* for a fixed number *t*_{0} in
**I**. Consider the collection **F**(*P*) of
all differentiable real-valued functions defined on some neighborhood
of *P*. With the ordinary operations of function addition and
multiplication by a constant, **F**(*P*) has the structure
of a vector space. Each function *f* in **F**(*P*)
varies smoothly with *u*, along the path of γ,
in some neighborhood of *P*. Its rate of variation at
*P* =
γ(*t*_{0}) is properly
expressed by the derivative *d*(*f* ○γ)/*d**u* at *u* =
*t*_{0}. As *f* ranges over
**F**(*P*), the value of *d*(*f* ○γ)/*d**u* at *u* =
*t*_{0} is apt to vary in
**R**. So we have here a mapping of **F**(*P*)
into **R**, which we denote by
γ·(*u*).
It is in
fact a linear function and therefore a vector in the dual space
**F***(*P*) of real-valued linear functions on
**F**(*P*). Call it the *tangent* to
γ
at *P*. The tangents
at *P* to all the curves whose paths go through *P* span an *n*-dimensional
subspace of **F***(*P*). This subspace is, by definition,
the tangent space *T*_{P}**M**. The
tangent spaces at all points of an *n*-manifold **M** can be
bundled together in a natural way into a 2*n*-manifold
*T***M**. The projection mapping
π
of
*T***M** onto **M** assigns to each tangent
vector **v** in
*T*_{P}**M** the point
π(**v**)
at which **v** is tangent to **M**. The
structure <*T***M**,**M**,π> is the tangent
bundle over **M**. A vector field on **M** is
a section of *T***M**, i.e., a differentiable mapping
** f** of

**M**into

*T*

**M**such that π ○

**sends each point**

*f**P*of

**M**to itself; such a mapping obviously assigns to

*P*a vector in

*T*

_{P}

**M**.

Any vector space **V** is automatically associated with
other vector spaces, such as the dual space **V*** of
linear functions on **V**, and the diverse spaces of
multilinear functions on **V**, on **V***,
and on any possible combination of **V** and
**V***. This holds, of course, for each tangent space of
an *n*-manifold **M**. The dual of
*T*_{P}**M** is known as the
cotangent space at *P*. There is a natural way of bundling together the
cotangent spaces of **M** into a 2*n*-manifold, the
cotangent bundle. Generally speaking, all the vector spaces of a
definite type associated with the tangent and cotangent spaces of
**M** can be naturally bundled together into a *k*-manifolds
(for suitable integers *k*, depending on the nature of the bundled
items). A section of any of these bundles is a *tensor field* on
**M** (of rank *r*, if the bundled objects are *r*-linear
functions).

A *Riemannian metric* **g** on the *n*-manifold
<**M**,**A**> is a tensor field of rank
2 on **M**. Thus, **g** assigns to each *P* in
**M** a bilinear function
**g**_{P} on
*T*_{P}**M**. For any *P* in
**M** and any vectors **v**,
**w**, in *T*_{P}**M**,
**g**_{P} must meet these
requirements:

**g**_{P}(**v**,**w**) =**g**_{P}(**w**,**v**) (symmetry)**g**_{P}(**v**,**w**) = 0 for all vectors**w**in*T*_{P}**M**if and only if**v**is the 0-vector (non-degeneracy)**g**_{P}(**v**,**v**) > 0 unless**v**is the 0-vector (positive definiteness).

It is worth noting that the so-called Lorentzian metrics defined by
relativity theory on its spacetime models meet requirements (i) and
(ii), but not (iii), and are therefore usually said to be
*semi-Riemannian* or *pseudo-Riemannian*.

The length
λ(**v**) of a vector **v**
in *T*_{P}**M** is defined by |λ(**v**)|^{2} =
**g**_{P}(**v**,**
v**). Let
γ
be a curve in **M**. Let
γ·(*u*)
be the
tangent to
γ
at
the point
γ(*u*).
The
length of
γ's
path from
γ(*a*) to
γ(*b*) is
measured by the integral

∫ baλ(γ·( u))du

Thus, in Riemannian geometry, the length of the tangent vector
γ·(*u*)
bears
witness to the advance of curve *g* as it passes through the point
γ(*u*).
The definition
of the length of a curve leads at once to the notion of a geodesic (or
straightest) curve, which is characterized by the fact that its length
is extremal; in other words, a geodesic is either the greatest or the
shortest among all the curves that trace out neighboring paths between
the same two points.

In his study of curved surfaces, Gauss introduced a real-valued
function, the *Gaussian curvature*, which measures a surface's
local deviation from flatness in terms of the surface's intrinsic
geometry. Riemann extended this concept of curvature to Riemannian
*n*-manifolds. He observed that each geodesic through a point in such a
manifold is fully determined by its tangent vector at that point.
Consider a point *P* in a Riemannian *n*-manifold
<**M**,**A**,**g**> and
two linearly independent vectors **v** and
**w** in *T*_{P}**M**.
The geodesics determined by all linear combinations of
**v** and **w** form a 2-manifold about *P*,
with a definite Gaussian curvature
*K*_{P}(**v**,**w**) at
*P*. The real number
*K*_{P}(**v**,**w**)
measures the curvature of **M** at *P* in the “surface
direction” (Riemann 1854, p. 145) fixed by **v** and
**w**. In particular, if *n* = 3 and
*K*_{P}(**v**,**w**)
takes the same constant value *k* for every choice of the point
*P* and of the vectors **v** and **w**, then
the manifold
<**M**,**A**,**g**> is a
realization of Euclidian space if *k* = 0, of Lobachevskian
space if *k* < 0, and of either spherical
or elliptic space if *k* > 0. Riemann
(1861) thought up a global mapping, depending on the metric
**g**, that yields the appropriate values of
*K*_{P}(**v**,**w**) on
appropriate arguments *P*, **v** and **w**.
Nowadays this object is conceived as a tensor field of rank 4, which
assigns to each point *P* in a Riemannian *n*-manifold
<**M**,**A**,**g**> a
4-linear function on the tangent space
*T*_{P}**M**. It is therefore known
as the *Riemann tensor*. Given the above definition of
*K*_{P}(**v**,**w**) it
is clear that, if *n* = 2, the Riemann tensor reduces to the Gaussian
curvature function.