Supplement to Ibn Bâjja

Sources for Ibn Bâjja's Bibliography

The sources for his biography are few and short; the longest notice was written by a foe, Abû Naṣr al-Fatḥ Ibn Muḥammad Ibn Khaqân (d. 1134?) in a poetry anthology (Ibn Khaqân 1966, pp. 346–353).

According to Ibn Khaqân, Avempace “investigated the celestial bodies, the boundaries of the earth climates and rejected the Book of Allâh”. He did not believe in the resurrection, affirmed the eternity of time, and that man is a plant; he had fun playing music. Al-Fatḥ reproduces various poems of Avempace,[1] one is a long panegyric to the Almoravid Prince Abû Bakr ibn Ibrâhîm aṣ-Ṣahrawî better known as Ibn Tîfilwît “governor of the frontier and of the West [of al-Andalus]”. M. Asín Palacios (Asín Palacios 1900) and Nemesio Morata (1924) already doubted the truth of Ibn Khaqân's accusations against Ibn Bâjja whom he had praised in former times.

Another source of information are three letters of Ibn Sîd al-Baṭalyawsî (d. 1127) mentioned by N. Morata (1924) in the Escorial manuscript 488, ff. 35vº–37rº in which he complains about the arrogant behavior of Ibn Bâjja. They have been published by Ḥ. Mu’nis (2000, pp. 34–37). Further D.M. Dunlop (1957a, Life, pp. 188–196) described the notice on Ibn Bajja written by a contemporary of Avempace called Ibn Bashrûn in his work al-Mukhtâr min an-naẓr wa-n-nathr and transmitted by Sibṭ Ibn al-Jawzî (d. 1256-7) in Mir’at az-zamân (1952, pp. 172–173).

The notice is full of praise for Avempace who authored books on mathematics, logic and geometry. The text observes that Avempace was, for 20 years, a vizier in the service of Yaḥyà ibn Yûsuf Ibn Tashfîn (or Tashufîn) and that he was a victim of envious physicians who poisoned him. Ibn Bashrûn says that Avempace died in 533 AH/1139 CE, but he does not say how old he was.

Later biographies are based on these two authors. ‛Imâd ad-Dîn Kâtib al-Isfahânî (1125–1201) mentions Ibn Bashrûn as his source (1971, nº 94, pp. 332–334). The notice in Ibn al-Qifṭî (d. 1248) is very short: it praises Avempace; says that he was vizier of Yaḥyà ibn Tâshfîn and that he was poisoned by envious physicians. Ibn al-Qifṭî claims that al-Fatḥ ibn Khaqân had asked Avempace for his poetry to include it in the anthology, and that he fooled Avempace, because he used it to make a negative entry of him (Ibn al-Qifṭî 1903, p. 406).

Ibn Abî Uṣaybi‛a (d. 1269/70) remarks that Avempace died “young” and includes a list of his works; his biography is in very positive tones (1886, pp. 62–64; 2001, pp. 271–277). Ibn Khallikân (1211–1282) gives the month of his death as Ramadan 533 AH (May 1139 AD) and adds that “it is said that he died in 535 poisoned with an eggplant in Fez” (1998, nº 670, pp. 222–225). Ibn Khallikân mentions also that “Bâjja in the language of the Francs of the West means silver”, and the meaning can be related to Ṣâ’igh, “silversmith” so that his Arabic surname was “son of the silversmith”. There is however the Latin term pacta “bride”, in Arabic ‛arûs, with a similar sound because ct becomes ch in Romance and Latin-Romance p becomes b in Arabic; Ibn al-‛Arûs was a frequent surname, or nisba.

Lisân ad-Dîn Ibn al-Khaṭîb (d. 1374) referenced Avempace in his entry on the Almoravid amir Abû Bakr aṣ-Ṣaḥrâwî, Ibn Tîfilwît (1958, pp. 412–417), the protector of Avempace; and Aḥmad al-Maqqarî (d. 1631)[2] drew on Ibn Khaqân as well as on Lisân ad-Dîn Ibn al-Khaṭîb. There also a few references in the manuscripts about Avempace's works.

Copyright © 2012 by
Josep Puig Montada <puigmont@filol.ucm.es>

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