Supplement to Idiolects

Appendix: Lewis's Theory of Languages as Conventions

A language, for Lewis, is a function from sentences to meanings, and a theory of meaning for a language will describe this function. As such, the language is an abstract object. For this abstract object to be realized in the world, on Lewis's view, is for a community to adopt it as a convention governing their thoughts and actions. To understand the proposal, we need to understand what Lewis means by ‘convention’, and to understand how a function from sentences to meanings could be a convention in this general sense.

In simple terms, a convention is a practice that solves a co-ordination problem within a community. The solution will bring mutual benefits but it will also be arbitrary. For example, the practice in North America of driving on the right is a convention in this sense: it is a mutually beneficial practice, but at least one other solution to the problem of avoiding head-on collisions is available: driving on the left. Languages seem to be conventions in this simple sense. The existence of shared meanings within a community is clearly of mutual benefit. It allows people to learn one another's thoughts about the world, for example. But the meanings of sentences are also arbitrary, as is evident from the use within different communities of different sentences with the same meaning.

Moving beyond this simple account of conventionality, Lewis tells us that a convention in his sense is a regularity R in action (driving on the left, for example) or in belief within a population P for which the following six conditions nearly always hold:

  1. Everyone conforms to R.
  2. Everyone believes the others conform to R.
  3. The belief in (2) gives each believer a (practical or epistemic) reason to conform to R.
  4. General conformity is generally preferred to slightly-less-than-general conformity.
  5. R is not the only regularity that could satisfy (3) and (4).
  6. (1)–(5) are known matters of mutual knowledge: they are known to everyone, and it is known that they are known to everyone, and so on.

(2) and (3) jointly predict that R perpetuates itself within the community (as in (1)), despite being (according to (5)) arbitrarily chosen. A convention is stable within a community because it is rational for each member of the community to abide by it.

How could a language in Lewis's sense (a function pairing sentences with meanings) give rise to a convention in his sense, i.e., a regularity satisfying conditions (1) to (6)? Lewis's answer is that the regularity of being truthful and trusting in L can be a convention in a community — and when it is, L is the community's language. To be truthful in L is to utter a sentence only if one believes that what it means in L holds. To be trusting in L is to believe whatever is meant in L by the sentences one hears uttered. Being truthful and trusting in L is a convention in a linguistic community if the following six conditions hold, at least for the most part:

  1. Everyone is truthful and trusting in L.
  2. Everyone believes the others are truthful and trusting in L.
  3. The belief in (2) gives each a reason to be truthful and trusting in L.
  4. General conformity to truthfulness and trustfulness in L is generally preferred to slightly-less-than-general conformity.
  5. L is not the only language that could satisfy (3) and (4).
  6. (1)–(5) are known matters of mutual knowledge: they are known to everyone, and it is known that they are known to everyone, and so on.

Lewis call the situation of a language's being realized in this way a ‘perfect case of normal language use’. That is, it is at best an idealization in need of refinement. Chomsky and Davidson can be thought of as suggesting, in their different ways, that the conception of a language and its realization offered here is fundamentally mistaken and not merely crude.

Copyright © 2010 by
Alex Barber <a.barber@open.ac.uk>

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